William James at the Boundaries: Philosophy, Science, and the Geography of Knowledge

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Francesca Bordogna, William James at the Boundaries: Philosophy, Science, and the Geography of Knowledge, U. of Chicago Press, 2008, 382pp., $39.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226066523.

Reviewed by Ruth Anna Putnam, Wellesley College



In her concluding paragraph Francesca Bordogna describes her book as “[a] combination of intellectual history, history of science, and what one may call ‘philosophy studies’”. I mention this at the outset because one must not expect this book to be a philosophical examination of James’ philosophy. Just as “science studies” are not science, so Bordogna chose the characterization “philosophy studies” modestly and wisely. That said, the book is an ambitious and on the whole successful presentation of the disciplinary debates in American universities at the turn of the twentieth century, particularly as they concern drawing or transgressing boundaries between psychology and philosophy. As Bordogna sees it, William James’ philosophy engaged in “boundary work”. She seeks to answer the question, “Yet what prompted James in the first place to transgress the divides increasingly separating disciplines, types of discourse, and groups of investigators?” I do not find fully persuasive her attempt to show that such transgressions are essential to James’ (supposed) aim of reconfiguring not only relations between scholars but also relations between citizens. Indeed, I am not persuaded that this was his aim. Nor do I believe that James’ interest in abnormal and psychic phenomena played as large a role in his life as the author suggests. Nevertheless, I am a philosopher not a historian of ideas. As I already said, as history of ideas the book is successful: it provides an interesting, sometimes even gripping, account of certain issues that were very much alive a hundred and some years ago and have their analogues in today’s explosion of new cross-boundaries disciplines, e.g., cognitive science. Let us turn to details.

Knowledge — both in the sense of the activity of coming to know as pursued in universities, research institutes, and industrial laboratories and also in the sense of the product of that activity — lends itself to a geographical metaphor. There are fields, fields have boundaries, fields may be adjacent, and boundaries may be disputed or transgressed or firmly established. Philosophy, in particular, has fluid boundaries. Switching metaphors, the trunk of the tree of knowledge is philosophy while the various sciences, beginning with mathematics, followed by physics and biology, etc. are the branches that in time branched off. Various models of the organization of knowledge are discussed in chapter 7 of the book under review. By the turn of the twentieth century, psychology was sufficiently developed, one might say “sufficiently scientific”, to branch off the parent tree. Thus returning now to Francesca Bordogna’s geographic metaphor, boundaries between psychology and philosophy were drawn, were disputed, and were transgressed.

At the same time, the place of philosophy in the university had to be renegotiated. Its earlier role as the culminating and unifying conclusion of a college education was called into question. Bordogna uses the building and the positioning of Emerson Hall at Harvard to represent one outcome of such negotiation (chapters 1 and 7). Emerson Hall, from its opening to this day, houses the offices of Harvard philosophers as well as many of the halls in which they lecture. According to James’ colleague Hugo Münsterberg, Emerson Hall represented both the unification of philosophy and the drawing of its boundaries — philosophers’ studies and lecture halls were no longer scattered among the other disciplines. Meanwhile, Emerson Hall’s position relative to the other buildings in Harvard Yard represented philosophy’s culminating or unifying position within knowledge (or, perhaps, within the teaching of knowledge). One wishes Bordogna had provided a map. In any case, neither the geographical metaphor nor that of a tree of knowledge suits James’ ultimate conception of philosophy as that which unifies knowledge by facilitating communication between the practitioners of various disciplines.

A brief glance at the development of William James’ position is here in order. In 1890 he published The Principles of Psychology, for many years a widely used textbook. In Principles James drew a clear line between psychology and philosophy. Psychology assumes mind-body dualism, a position inconsistent with James’ ontology of pure experience. Psychology takes for granted that there is a mind-independent world and that we can and do know a lot about it. Philosophy subjects these assumptions to critical examination. Nevertheless, one can find interesting and deep philosophy in Principles. Moreover, James frequently and egregiously transgressed the boundaries between philosophy and psychology.

Bordogna’s second framing example, the companion to Emerson Hall, is James’ presidential address to the annual meeting of the American Philosophical Association in 1906, “The Energies of Men”. This essay seems to propose a research program for psychology and, thus, to be a prime example of James’ transgressive behavior. As Bordogna explains in chapter 2, however, by 1894 James had already concluded that metaphysics and epistemology cannot be kept out of psychology. Thus, in the author’s view, James does “boundary work” in the 1894 essay “The Knowing of Things Together”.

Bordogna uses James’ interest in psychic research, of which she presents two examples in fascinating detail, to present James in opposition to the image of the uninvolved scientist concerned to obtain objective data. This seems to me to be a false opposition. One may take a passionate interest in the outcome of a certain experiment yet be fully committed to seeking objective data. James and Bordogna want to emphasize that certain kinds of data are by their nature less objective than others. However, I disagree with Bordogna if she means to suggest that James offers a different conception of evidence. She refers to James’ famous essay “The Will to Believe”, his defense of one’s right to believe ahead of the evidence in certain situations that he calls genuine options. In such a case both a hypothesis and its denial are live options — James takes it that both Christianity and agnosticism have a certain appeal to his audience. Both alternatives must be of great importance and such that waiting for additional evidence is, in fact, choosing one of the alternatives. James aptly speaks of faith. In relation to alleged psychic phenomena, however, James does not advocate belief but merely suspension of both belief and disbelief. Indeed, by failing to mention the conditions in which faith is justified, Bordogna implicitly supports misreadings of James.

James’ interest in psychic research serves well as an example of his commitment to the democratization of inquiry, that is, accepting amateur inquirers’ reports as relevant. This is an important transgression of the boundaries between amateur and professional, but such transgression is more common than Bordogna suggests. For example, amateur astronomers contribute significantly to the field of descriptive astronomy. There is no reason to think that the observations of amateur astronomers are not evidence in the same sense as those of professionals. Bordogna seems to suggest that the notions of evidence in play in the natural sciences differ from those in the social sciences or in introspective psychology. I am inclined to doubt that this is the most fruitful way to consider evidence in various contexts. In any case, when James defends one’s right to believe the religious hypothesis in advance of the evidence, he means by “evidence” exactly what his opponents, for instance, Clifford, mean when they find the evidence insufficient, and, indeed, James agrees with that claim; faith is precisely belief on insufficient evidence.

Bordogna offers a lengthy exposition of pragmatism, specifically of Jamesean pragmatism. Unfortunately, on p.135 she begins a sentence, “Introducing pragmatism to a broad public in 1906”. This is misleading. As James tells his audience in the very lecture she has in mind, “[The term pragmatism] was first introduced into philosophy by Mr. Charles Peirce in 1878”. After an explanation of the principle of pragmatism, James continues, “It lay entirely unnoticed until I … brought it forward again … By that date (1898) the times seemed right for its reception” (William James, Pragmatism, chapter 2). James continues to describe the spread of pragmatism in the intervening eight years. Of course, Bordogna knows this; she tries too hard, it seems to me, to present James as unique in his commitment to blur or transgress boundaries between psychology and philosophy, between professionals and amateurs, and between human beings.

Bordogna now asks why, if many others found cognition to be tied to sensation and volition, the view was greeted with protest when it was presented by pragmatists. The answer, she promises, will turn out to have to do with the borders between psychology and philosophy, and ultimately with the nature of philosophy. To see this, let us turn to James’ theory of truth. Bordogna follows Hilary Putnam’s account of that theory but complains that Putnam slights James’ “contention that not only interests but emotions, volitions and purposes could play an important role in the production of truth, and perhaps even enter into its definition” (p. 142). This contention, however, rephrased as “the importance that James seemed to confer on satisfaction in his account of truth” is the basis for Bordogna’s conclusions summarized above. By identifying what is satisfactory — a satisfactory solution to a problem, for example — with what gives rise to feeling satisfied, i.e., a pleasant feeling, and pleasant feelings with a physiological state, truth can be made out to consist of bodily feelings. Many find this position unacceptable, even philosophers otherwise sympathetic to James. I do not claim that Bordogna defends such a crude picture, and it certainly is not James’, but she recounts the often quite vociferous objections to his conception of truth as well as some views friendly to James without taking sides herself. Ultimately, it isn’t James’ view of truth but his view of the knower as an embodied intellect that interests her. That notion serves to justify psychologism, the introduction of psychological notions into philosophy, especially into logic and the theory of knowledge. The pragmatists were certainly guilty of that. To put it succinctly, pragmatism replaces the theory of knowledge by a theory of coming to know.

The American Psychological Association was founded in 1892, the American Philosophical Association in 1900. The former sought to expel philosophers, and the latter stated its purpose as "to promote the exchange of ideas among philosophers, to encourage creative and scholarly activity in philosophy, to facilitate the professional work and teaching of philosophers, and to represent philosophy as a discipline" (APA website, www.apaonline.org, emphasis mine). One can almost hear boundary walls being erected. James would respond that since human nature is both biological and cultural, an adequate theory of human nature must cross the boundaries between the various human and social sciences.

An adequate theory of human nature requires a theory of the self. Bordogna introduces James’ accounts of the self — there are several complementary accounts — and discusses them in the context of an anxiety that was widespread at the turn of the twentieth century: the notion of the rugged individual that had been the ideal in an earlier age did not fit the real position of most persons in industrial corporate capitalism.

Utopian socialism, sympathetically portrayed by Bordogna, was not a solution, nor were the various systems of mind cure and mental hygiene designed to unify the self. James has been accused of substituting problems of individual psychology for social/economic problems. It is to Bordogna’s credit that she denies this facile claim. She wonders where to locate James on the political spectrum and claims that simple labels won’t do. As have others before her, Bordogna settles on “mugwump”.

Bordogna asserts repeatedly that the boundaries of an individual are “porous and leaky”. That, she holds, provides a solution to a problem that troubled many at the turn of the twentieth century. This is the problem — or, better, bundle of problems: the new corporate capitalism undermines the unity of the self. James and Bordogna are interested in various techniques for unifying the self, from acquiring good habits to various kinds of mind cure, to the possibility of mystical experiences. Here, as earlier, it seems to me that Bordogna pays too much attention to James’ interest in abnormal psychology and psychic research and not enough to his philosophy. In any case, she points out repeatedly that the contours of the self are “leaky” and that this enables communication and cooperation among human beings. While James welcomes the possibility of one’s self being embedded in a larger consciousness, James rejects absolute idealism because it posits the dissolution of finite selves in the one infinite absolute. I find the chapter just summarized, titled “Ecstasy and Community: James and the Politics of the Self”, disappointing. Bordogna tries to cover too much ground in too few pages. We might want to emphasize, for example, that when James warns against what she calls “ancestral blindness”, what he has to say is of great importance as a lesson in democratic tolerance and does not presuppose his theories of the self. We might also like to be absolutely clear on the fact that for James there is no substantial self. Finally, We might have liked to have heard more about the stream of consciousness. No doubt, these are the complaints of a philosopher, but the picture of James that emerges does not do him justice.

Let us return, as Bordogna does, to the geography of knowledge. Just as Emerson Hall served Münsterberg, and thereby Bordogna, as a symbol for the proper position of philosophy and, in particular, its dominance vis-à-vis psychology at Harvard, so the International Congress of Arts and Sciences of 1904, another brain child of Münsterberg, was meant to demonstrate the dominating place of philosophy in the realm of knowledge. Bordogna presents in considerable detail various conceptions of knowledge as geography and as a tree, using these to contrast Münsterberg’s “imperialistic” conception of the realm of knowledge with James’ democratic conception of a republic of inquirers. This political vocabulary is well chosen, for the interest in the classification and unification of knowledge went beyond abstract schemes, beyond the organization of the academy to “the reordering of society” (p. 241). Bordogna’s account of the multiple disagreements between James and Münsterberg makes for exciting reading.

James presidential address, “The Energies of Men”, shows James in the role that is central to Bordogna’s conception of him. He advises his audience how to avoid becoming rigid and limited in outlook, how to remain flexible and open to new ideas. Yet James was never a revolutionary; Bordogna sees this clearly, though she might have given James more credit for his anti-imperialist activities. Ultimately, the picture of James that emerges seems to me somewhat skewed; it is thus an illustration of James’ view that one’s interest — here Bordogna’s interest in “boundary work” — affects one’s conception of reality.