William James in Focus: Willing to Believe

Placeholder book cover

William J. Gavin, William James in Focus: Willing to Believe, Indiana University Press, 2013, 111pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253007926.

Reviewed by Sarin Marchetti, University College Dublin


Given the breadth and richness of his intellectual biography, any recounting of the philosophy of William James would be impressionistic at best. However, as James tellingly remarked inPragmatism, philosophies themselves are necessarily "abstract outlines" whose significance and impact should be "measured by the definiteness of our summarizing reactions, by the immediate perceptive epithet with which the expert hits such complex objects off."[1] Thus, as there are better and worse philosophical "outlines", there would be better and worse accounts of them, so measured. William Gavin's book, for both insight and ambition, undoubtedly belongs among the better. He in fact offers, in one hundred pages, a concise and mostly effective sketch of James' arc of thought, in which the theme of the impressive and engaging nature of James' philosophical "outline" is expressly tackled.

This theme represents a recurrent motif underlying James' distinctive philosophical approach, which Gavin rightly takes as essential. Overlooking its importance would in fact radically betray the spirit of James' writings, altogether missing the point of his philosophical reflection. Gavin helps the reader to avoid these too-frequent shortcomings, offering an original account of James' philosophy in which the responsive, practical character of his writings is featured. As the subtitle suggests, the key to this critical survey is an examination of the role and pervasiveness of James' conception of "the will to believe" as it informs several aspects of his philosophical outlook. By focusing on the uses and applications of this notion, which the author considers the cornerstone of James' philosophy, the volume works as an erudite exposition of an entire intellectual trajectory.

Offering a perceptive fresco of James' philosophy as a whole, the volume is particularly useful for those interested in undertaking an in-depth study of his work. However, it is not an elementary introduction to James. Gavin weaves together a number of themes and issues that resonate in many debates and animate the best literature on James (most notably, thorny questions concerning the unorthodox character of James' philosophical style and methodology) and, more generally, raise questions about the status of pragmatism. Seasoned readers of James and pragmatism acquainted with such debates would thus likely profit more from it than the newcomer, who might be puzzled by the volume's non-linear and multi-layered composition, which reflects the complexity and intricacy of James' own philosophical thinking.

That said, the volume is surely a better (because more demanding and illuminating) starting point if compared with other general introductions to James and his philosophical legacy available on the market which, by exposing his alleged doctrines and achievements as if they were undisputed and unproblematic acquisitions that the other pragmatists either embraced or dismissed altogether, convey a much less interesting (because unfaithful) picture of this dense and fascinating chapter in the history of ideas. Contrary to other representative accounts, Gavin leaves productively open the various tensions and hesitations featured in James' work, making a few interesting references to the wider composite narrative of pragmatism also animated by the debate over the very feasibility of the Jamesian project. This surely complicates the reception of the volume but also makes its reading more rewarding.

In the past few decades Gavin has established himself as an authoritative reader of James. His fine scholarship has shed light on many neglected aspects of James' work and of pragmatism as a living intellectual tradition having deep roots in his eclectic writings. In his previous, also highly recommended, book on James,[2] Gavin investigated in detail what it means to take seriously James' commitment to "vagueness" in all its manifestations. In this book Gavin performed a similar operation with James' renowned -- albeit often disparaged and shallowly treated -- notion of the will to believe.[3] Since this idea is among the most discussed and controversial ideas thematized and articulated by James, Gavin's investigation of its philosophical purchase is of great value. He presents the will to believe as an extensive, far-reaching program informing virtually all James' work rather than a negligible, eccentric view advocated by him in a single essay ("The Will to Believe") from which a few out-of-context passages are cursorily quoted.

Gavin takes issue at the very outset with what he labels the strategy of "damage control" (12) frequently employed in defending the will to believe. He contrasts conservative efforts to undermine and relegate the will to believe to reflection on -- and resolution about -- those domains related to matters of morality (where a degree of psychological subjectivism is generally tolerated) with efforts contiguous with the hard sciences (where objectivity and certainty allegedly reign, or so the presumption which James is resisting goes). Gavin states that the will to believe "should be employed wherever choices between options are ‘forced, living, and momentous'" (xi). The will to believe would in fact encompass the whole arc of our experiences, reflections and conduct in so far as they are expressive of our engaged point of view on things despite the reflective domain at stake since "there are no hypotheses that, by domain of definition or content, are excluded from the will to believe" (14).

This closely recalls Richard Rorty's imaginative reading of James (and of pragmatism) as advocating a completion of the Enlightenment project, or a calling for a second Enlightenment.  He argued that we got rid of non-human authorities (divine as well as brute) in the practical matters of morals and politics thanks to the lesson of the secularist thinkers of the 17th and 18thcenturies, and that we should do the same in the theoretical sphere of knowledge, following the pragmatists in debunking the various dualisms (fact/value, reason/sentiment, cognitive/conative) informing the theoretical/practical divide unfortunately still much in vogue in the philosophical debate and in our ordinary practices alike.[4] By refusing to acknowledge the continuum between theoretical and practical matters, between epistemology and ethics, we in fact fall back into the problematic dualistic thinking from whose grip pragmatist thinkers have been trying to free us. The danger we would run, as Rorty remarked after James, is not only that of turning our backs on a meaningful portion of reality and the possibility of properly examining it, but the even greater danger, due to our narrow outlook, of vitiating our very capacity for reflection on the part to which we thought we were properly attending. As Dewey argued,[5] these two misgivings reinforce each other, and both should be firmly resisted as the first seminal step to our intellectual coming to maturity.[6]

Pragmatism's ambitious philosophical agenda thus lies at the core of the larger cultural project of resolute emancipation from the superstitious mindset picturing the norms governing our practices (of judgment and action) as making reference to non-human standards. According to James, pragmatism's distinctive philosophical contribution to this project is framing an enriched, practicable notion of rationality, expressive of our interested and responsible stance toward reality. In a passage Rorty finds congenial, James depicts the pragmatist as advocating an "alteration of the seat of authority that reminds one almost of the protestant reformation",[7] a shift of emphasis from essences to human activities as the criterion and reference for human inquiries and their resolutions across the board. It is in this vein that James contrasted the unengaged vocabulary of representation with the willful one of agency, showing the advantage of extending the latter to both the theoretical and the practical domain.

By resisting the attempt to restrict the scope and potential of the will to believe, Gavin shows how pragmatism in a Jamesian vein is a totally radical philosophy,that does not fall short of its progressive credo of a global re-humanization of our life of the mind. Consistent with this radical characterization, says Gavin, James understood the will to believe as a sustained, engaged attitude toward reality rather than as a punctual, heuristic device: a way of life to be constantly explored rather than a problem-solving strategy to be occasionally applied. Furthermore, by giving us no certainty about the expected result when we employ it in resolving critical situations, the will to believe "is not a onetime affair, but rather a stance that we must continually reaffirm, with varying degrees of success" (15). There will thus always remain a shade of doubt about the successfulness of an option whose evaluation can only ever take place in the midst of the very practices it reinforces.

Finally, as a corollary to the latter observation, Gavin presents the will to believe as internally related to James' wider "metaphysical presuppositions": the credo in an unresolved, unfinished universe in which we are actively called to participate by exercising our best energies, experimenting with novel conduct, and giving voice to our unique perspectival take on reality (and thus on ourselves and our peers). James exhorts us to live courageously and act heroically in the face of the loss of meaning and value, and in the contingency of doubt, peril and death, questioning at the same time the very capacity of philosophical reflection to account for such prospects and eventualities -- and, thus, ultimately, for human finitude -- without "explaining away" their tragic dimension. According to Gavin, James voiced the limits of a reflective comprehension of the rawness of reality, challenging us to "deal" with it without pretending to "solve" it as if it was a problem we could just write off (72-5).[8]

This elaborate characterization of the will to believe enables Gavin to introduce the single most interesting programmatic and methodological stance in his book: asserting the presence in James' work of both a "manifest" and a "latent" message (presented in ch. 1), pertaining to two different ways in which the will to believe can be read to be working.

According to Gavin, James offered plenty of radical and innovative descriptions of our mindedness and our worldliness, as well as of their dynamic intertwinement in which our active, willful contribution is emphasized (constituting the manifest message of his work). However, Gavin adds that the attentive reception of those same texts would convey a sense of the impossibility of those descriptions being complete or definitive (thus suggesting a deeper, latent message in his work, voicing this impossibility), since our engaged, deliberative attitude is a never-ending and ultimately uncertain interpretative endeavor. In fact, to the perceptive reader James' texts eventually "turn out to be 'directive' rather than ‘descriptive' in nature . . . . [to be] partial and unfinished interpretations rather than neutral observations" (xii). They are pronouncements pointing beyond themselves in order to to invite the subject to immerse herself back into the thickness of reality rather than skimming over its surface by means of thin definitions. Philosophical statements would thus cease to work as neutral descriptive labels depicting how things simply are and rather figure as normative pointers leading us to congenial and effective regions of experience, reflection, and conduct. His texts would thus be directive without being prescriptive, as that would clash with the liberating and expressive character that, according to James, philosophical prose should have.  For James, philosophical language should be able to convey the open, intense, and demanding character of those fringe fields of reality that we often disregard but are worth reflecting on.

The productive (even though sometimes problematic) interaction between the manifest and the latent picture, rather than betraying a bald inconsistency in their very dialectic, depicts James' texts as responsive partners in an ongoing critical conversation over our ways of worldmaking. Approached this way, James' pragmatism becomes a reflective and practical tool as we work to best address the difficulties posed both by reality and philosophy. Rather than a positive theory or grand system of thought offering us ready-made solutions, pragmatism would be thus understood by James as a philosophical temperament, method, and Weltanschauung, whose potentialities and payoffs are up to us to explore in the midst of our intellectual and ordinary practices. According to this reading there would be no closed, particular agenda defining the Jamesian pragmatist outlook, but rather only a set of emphases (on activity, conduct and imagination) and attitudes (anti-representationalism, fallibilism, holism) conveying its distinctive orientation.

I find this angle on James extremely productive. It allows us to make sense of his texts understood as "spurs" rather than "resting places" (91) by inviting a reading of his pragmatism as a form of philosophical therapy, and thus of James as a philosophical quietist according to whom the point of philosophical activity is a transformation of ourselves aimed at a critical elucidation of our assumptions and an understanding of our practices. To be sure, this is not the terminology Gavin uses; he prefers Cornel West's signature expression "prophetic pragmatism"[9] to express the gist of James metaphilosophy. The difference amounts to how one reads such terms as "settling" and "clarifying" in James' formulation and use of the pragmatic maxim (80-3). Gavin marks a contrast between "understanding" the meaning of a certain issue and "resolving" it by providing a satisfying answer to it (associating the first interpretation with Peirce exclusively), but I am inclined to think that this creates a false dichotomy. We find in James a distinctive sense of philosophical understanding or conceptual clarification implying a resolution about a certain issue having both a reflective and a distinctively practical dimension related to the way in which we deal with it -- where the notion of dealing touches the way in which we make sense of things by giving them normative value in an ongoing transformative renegotiation.

In the central parts of the book, Gavin shows how this elaborate philosophical machinery is at work in James' writings on psychology (ch. 3), religious experience (ch. 4), metaphysics (ch. 6), and language (ch. 7), with two more chapters dedicated to the metaphilosophical stakes and significance of Pragmatism (ch. 5 and conclusion). The presence of the manifest/latent double register is used by Gavin to see such texts in a new light, thus making sense of some of their most troubling passages -- a strategy achieving remarkable results as in the discussion of a nuanced text such as The Varieties of Religious Experience (1902) or of James's instructive reflections on language and the nature of concepts to be found in The Principles of Psychology (1890) and in the Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912). Gavin addresses two critiques of James' will to believe (in ch. 8), from the Right (Ayer and positivism) and the Left (Dostoevsky and Kafka). In the epilogue he goes back to the delicate co-existence and effective interplay of the manifest and the latent dimensions in James' writings, questioning (for the affirmative) their respective viability as well as their mutual compatibility in the light of the broader pragmatist quest for meaning and normativity as James understood it.

In conclusion, although there are surely some interpretative emphases with which I would disagree (most related to the practical significance of James' texts). I find Gavin's reconstruction of James particularly welcome. He convincingly shows that a focus on James' methodology (and on the metaphilosophical maneuver informing it) would do a timely service not only to our reception of his work, but also to our very appreciation of pragmatism more generally as a lively and much needed philosophical orientation when traveling the narrow but crucial path of practicing philosophy in a way which, as Wittgenstein said, "does not spare other people the trouble of thinking . . . [but], if possible, rather stimulates someone to thoughts of his own".[10]

[1] William James, Pragmatism (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1975 [1907]), 25. Compare with the opening lecture of A Pluralistic Universe (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1977 [1909]), where James restates that "No philosophy can ever be anything but a summary sketch, a picture of the world in abridgment, a foreshortened bird's-eye view of the perspective of events" (p. 9).

[2] Wiliam J. Gavin, William James and the Reinstatement of the Vague (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1992).

[3] Far from being at odds, Gavin's two projects have a lot of illuminating cross-references and productive overlaps. These result from his imaginative overall approach to James' writings as open-ended, directional devices. James' writings allow us to appreciate the thickness and incompleteness of reality and to act with a more genuine and liberating resolution.

[4] See for example Richard Rorty, "Pragmatism as Anti-Authoritarianism", Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 53: 7-20. It is noticeable how the best current philosophical debate on these themes, within as well as outside pragmatism, revolves exactly around the opportunity, convenience, and eventual strategy for a second Enlightenment such as James and Rorty envisioned.

[5] See for example John Dewey, "Does Reality Possess Practical Character?" in Middle Works, 1899-1924, vol. 4 (Carbondale: Southern Illinois Press, 1977 [1908]); "The Need for a Recovery in Philosophy", in Middle Works, 1899-1924, vol. 10 (Carbondale: Southern Illinois Press, 1980).

[6] A brilliant discussion of the tenability of this strategy for taming epistemology critical of Rorty (and of his reading of Dewey) can be found in John McDowell, "Towards Rehabilitating Objectivity", in Robert B. Brandom, ed., Reading Rorty (Oxford: Blackwell, 2000), which elaborates on material from his masterpiece Mind and World (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994).

[7] William James, Pragmatism (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1975 [1907]), 62. See also James’ famous letter to his brother Henry dated May 4, 1907, now in The Correspondence Of William James, vol. XI, ed. I. K. Skrupskelis and E. M. Berkeley (Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press, 2003).

[8] The way Gavin marks a contrast between Jamesian "troubles" and Deweyan "problems" unfortunately turns a difference into a gulf. Dewey was not unaware of the occasional reflective opacity of reality, which was the motive for James’ critique of its over-intellectualization. For a more elaborated treatment of Dewey’s conception of problems (of its strengths as well as its shortcomings), see Colin Koopman, Pragmatism as Transition: Historicity and Hope in James, Dewey and Rorty (New York: Columbia University Press, 2009, esp. ch. 7).

[9] Cornel West, The American Evasion of Philosophy:. A Genealogy of Pragmatism (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1989).

[10] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, ed. Elizabeth Anscombe (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1953), viii. I am grateful to Colin Koopman and Fergal McHugh for taking time to read the review and offer valuable comments.