Wily Elites and Spirited Peoples in Machiavelli's Republicanism

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David N. Levy, Wily Elites and Spirited Peoples in Machiavelli's Republicanism, Lexington Books, 2014, 147pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739186404.

Reviewed by Robyn Marasco, Hunter College, CUNY


David N. Levy presents Machiavelli as a political thinker for our times and a touchstone for clarifying a republican concept of liberty. Levy's reading turns the importance of class conflict in sustaining the free way of life on "wily elites" and "spirited peoples" as guardians of republican liberty. He develops this reading primarily through The Discourses on Livy, though Levy believes that The Prince contains an essentially republican political teaching. In this way, Levy follows Quentin Skinner in seeing republican liberty as fundamental to Machiavelli's political thought. But Machiavelli's republicanism, for Levy, is precisely why we must read him "out of context" and against historicist methods, why we cannot permit contextualism to get in the way of a fruitful encounter with Machiavelli. Ultimately, says Levy, Skinner himself did not adhere to a strict historicism, for he too sees in Machiavelli's republicanism a significant corrective to our political way of life. Put differently, even Skinner permits Machiavelli to speak to us in a normative voice. Levy's book amplifies the republican voice in Machiavelli that speaks of class conflict and the free way of life.

Levy's critique of historicism could have been deepened and extended. And his own debt to Skinner's republican reading of Machiavelli could have been more systematically acknowledged. I suspect that there is a way to defend contextualist hermeneutics and normative argument, of the sort Levy finds in Skinner. But I appreciate Levy's overall ambition to forge an interpretive alternative to historicism -- without, it should be added, simply repeating a Straussian line on Machiavelli. The best recent work on Machiavelli shares in this ambition.

Levy takes seriously the curious fact that Machiavelli continues to hold our interest, not as a fount of historical knowledge but as a resource for political thinking. My frustration with this book is not that it lingers on what Machiavelli says to us, for here Levy is fully persuasive, but that it sets political theoretical debate in the narrowest of terms, between a liberal and a republican concept of liberty in which each is barely distinct from the other. The problem is not with reading Machiavelli out of context. (Against Skinner and even beyond Levy, I see anachronism itself as a totally legitimate intellectual practice.) The problem is with an approach to Machiavelli in which he is made to affirm our present way of life.

Levy is at his best when underscoring that, for Machiavelli, politics is class conflict and that a meaningful practice of freedom is possible only where conflict between classes has public and institutional form. He offers an important argument for distinguishing the class desires that divide a city. Levy shows how the conflict between the elites and the people is a conflict not only between opposed sets of political interest, but also between distinct political desires: the desire to dominate and the desire not to be dominated. And he attends to the most important issues in Machiavelli's attitude toward the Roman Republic -- that it flourished not despite but because of its class conflict, that it was founded by accident as much as virtù, that it thrived on the passions of the people.

I am fully sympathetic to the project of rendering Machiavellian politics in terms of class conflict and agree that the people and the elites are profoundly different in their attributes and passions. Levy also makes the essential and very insightful point that, for Machiavelli, aristocracy is an illusion and an ideological instrument. "The traditional distinction between aristocracy and oligarchy was a distinction between the rule of the virtuous few and the rule of the vicious few, but Machiavelli . . . distinguishes only between the few who are restrained by fear and the few who are not so restrained" (10-11). Put differently, fear of the people is what forces the elite to curb their desire to dominate. There is no meaningful rule of the few that is not oligarchic, and no earnest investment in the common good on the part of the few. By their nature and position, the elite aim to oppress the people. The idea of an aristocracy is a ruse in the service of class oppression.

The book's third chapter, on the causes and cures for corruption, is especially strong. It offers what Levy describes as a "natural-scientific" interpretation of the problem of corruption in Machiavelli. This chapter also details the importance of rhetoric and the complex of passions in Machiavelli. Finally, this is also the place where Levy gives real consideration to the role of religion in Machiavelli's political thinking, arguing that it is the people's religiosity that makes for their moral probity. Levy claims that Machiavelli does not reject Christianity as much as its "false interpretations" -- a hotly contested view, to be sure, but one that requires more careful explication of what distinguishes the good from the bad in matters of religion. It is not enough to say that Machiavelli considers religion from the perspective of politics and for its influence on public life. Levy needs to specify the elements of a properly civic religion, pagan or Christian, and how a "true" interpretation of Christianity would educate a citizenry differently and better. He suggests that the ideal of self-sacrifice may be one such element of a "politically salutary" Christianity, but his discussion is hurried and the theoretical claims are underdeveloped. Still, Levy's treatment of the problem of corruption in Machiavelli, as the place where "natural science" and "religion" meet, will repay the reader's attention.

Another strength of Levy's work is the attention to international affairs and the question of imperialism in Machiavelli. Levy presents the Machiavellian position as favoring neither several weak states (Italy, in Machiavelli's time) nor one strong state (ancient Rome, at the moment of its decline), but many strong states in which no single power is absolutely dominant. Once again, it may seem as if Machiavelli's view is made, too abruptly, to conform to contemporary sensibilities. Nevertheless, Levy engages Maurizio Viroli, Mark Hulliung, and others for a genuinely fruitful reading of Machiavelli on international relations and the political theory of empire.

Levy ventures toward the very powerful argument that Machiavelli's view of the free way of life is itself the life of class consciousness and class struggle -- an image of freedom radically apart from prevailing notions of individualism and negative liberty. But he ultimately stops short of taking class difference and inequality as seriously as Machiavelli does. Politics remains, for Levy, an individual affair: it is the art of forging compromise between popular and elite interests.

Levy's Machiavelli is proto-liberal, politically moderate, and bourgeois to the core. This general view compromises some of the book's insights. For instance, Machiavelli's account of the rich and their desire to dominate gets recast as a noble desire to "command" -- and readers are left with the impression that "wily elites" are also somehow inadvertent agents of moral education and freedom. The people's desire not to be dominated gets represented as the desire for security -- and security defined in mostly economic and individualistic terms. Somehow "spirited peoples" are also simply timid and fearful individuals, mostly interested in protecting their property. Levy's Machiavelli is neutral in the conflict between classes, as if the author of The Prince and The Discourses doesn't announce his position and assume a perspective. What could be called Machiavelli's partisanship -- his deepest alliance with the people and their passions -- drops out of Levy's analysis. Politics appears as a protracted social-balancing act, in which the different humors correct for the extremes of the other and the middle way provides the path forward.

Levy compares this political balancing act to the "invisible hand" -- suggesting an affinity between Machiavelli's politics and the theoretical foundations of capitalist political economy. It is not that he is much interested in the early life of commercial capitalism in the Northern Italian city-states of Machiavelli's time, which would be one way to rethink the political project and its implications. Nor is it that Levy advances the Gramscian position that Machiavelli is the theorist of the origins of the (bourgeois) nation-state. The point, for Levy, is that a Machiavellian world is one in which we all think and act like homo economicus.

Surely this is Levy's world, in which individuals are encouraged to think like businessmen and behave in terms of economic interests and considerations, but is it really Machiavelli's? By what interpretative methods does a Machiavellian concept of republican liberty become indistinguishable from the ethos of neoliberal capitalism? Levy argues that we should treat Machiavellian liberty as an instrument, not as an end in itself, that we should see in civic life an opportunity for profit and individual flourishing, not the realization of collective aims or specifically political ambitions. But in making Machiavelli speak to us, I fear that Levy has made Machiavelli speak for us and that the elements of The Discourses and The Prince that cannot be reconciled with contemporary conditions go unremarked. The dissonant and dissident voice in Machiavelli gets little attention.

Levy's book is a smart and engaging contribution to the voluminous secondary literature on Machiavelli. It stands apart for its readability and lucidity, and would make an excellent addition to an undergraduate seminar syllabus. For students working through Machiavelli's texts, and the industry of commentary on these texts, Levy provides an excellent introduction. More advanced readers and specialists will also find much to admire and appreciate. He brings fresh insight to Machiavelli's highly original account of the few and the many and its implications for our political theory and practice.