Wisdom in Love: Kierkegaard and the Ancient Quest for Emotional Integrity

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Rick Anthony Furtak, Wisdom in Love: Kierkegaard and the Ancient Quest for Emotional Integrity, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 248pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268028745.

Reviewed by Ed Mooney, University of Syracuse


Wisdom in Love is written in the wake of Nussbaum's The Therapy of Desire and Upheavals of Thought, as well as Frankfurt's The Reasons of Love and The Importance of What We Care About. Emotions have become a priority on major philosophical agendas because moral personhood is inconceivable without them. Williams, Cavell, Baier, and Stocker (as well as Nussbaum and Frankfurt) have entered a brief on behalf of emotions, and it is continued here by Rick Anthony Furtak. Broadly speaking, the brief includes the claims that in prizing persons, we prize a complement of emotion; that in prizing moral perception, we prize the emotional dispositions that make it possible; that in cultivating character, we cultivate virtues but also emotional sensibilities. Wisdom in Love aims to show that passions, love and concern, in particular, ground the substance of a worthy life and, perforce, a life of wisdom. A loving attachment, appropriately fixed and cultivated, underlies felt-significance. This makes the goods that animate a life matter. Conversely, a love that's misaligned or stunted brings on personal deterioration and despair. Right action and reasonable belief presuppose apt emotional attunement to the world and others, as well as appropriately responsive character that is rooted in emotional dispositions and operative in moral perception. This gives a philosophical frame equipped to separate false, sentimental, inept, or frozen emotions from more worthy ones, tied deep into worthy roots.

Furtak's account is developed historically, conceptually, and phenomenologically. He is conversant with the details of Stoic thought and, equally, with Kierkegaard's moral psychology. This provides a basis for his historical comparison of Stoic denial of passion or emotion and Kierkegaard's qualified affirmation of it. It is especially helpful to see Kierkegaard developed in counterpoint to the Stoics, for nearly all the secondary literature places him either outside philosophy altogether or in dialogue only with Hegel, Kant, or early Romantics. But Kierkegaard also belongs in the neighborhood of Plato and Aristotle, not to mention the Stoics, all of whom he studied thoroughly. So we can thank Furtak for returning him there. Furtak's conversance with recent cognitive and volitional accounts of emotion allows him to advance our conceptual grasp of emotional attunement, as well. And his poetic ear allows him to present the fitting line or image from Rilke, Camus, or Heraclitus. This bolsters his phenomenological or existential evocation of emotion, giving texture to its ebb and flow. We emerge convinced of the contrasts between a life buoyed by a reticulated skein of meanings, and one beset by moral and personal suffering. And we come to see how each deepening of care is also a troubling exposure to future loss, casting a tragicomic shadow on our sufferings and endeavors.

In "Making Sense of Emotion" (Chapter One), Furtak argues that long-term dispositional concerns are the basis of everyday perceptions of significance. The oncoming truck is perceived (cognitively and emotionally) as a threat because we have a standing disposition to care for children, or at least to care for this child in its path. The evidence of a massacre elicits nausea and outrage because we have a standing concern for others, or at least concern for these mutilated others. Episodic emotions (anger, fear, delight) make sense against a background of deep, abiding passions. "Right" or "fitting" anger or alarm is construed as emotion based on accurate perception (there really is evidence of threat or massacre) and rooted in standing dispositions we can prize (care for children or persons more generally). Perhaps a moral monster is a creature biologically human but of perversely misaligned passions and emotions (rather than a creature failing in reason alone) -- or a creature of perverse indifference to anything on which passion or emotion might convey significance. In any case, on this view, rationality or cognition do not compete in a zero-sum game with emotions, but work hand in glove with them.

Chapters Two through Four comprise Part I: "Stoicism and its Discontents." Furtak distinguishes between two levels of Stoic distrust. The first holds that emotion (or passion) is always false; the second, that emotion is typically false. If emotions necessarily distort our access to the world, derailing our cognitive capacities, then eliminating them gives us access to the truth. Stoic moral psychology has an epistemological basis. Cold fury at an oak leaf betrays false emotion. This opens at least a conceptual place for true or fitting emotion. Furtak retains the epistemological framework while arguing that a default distrust of emotion is mistaken. True emotional response -- outrage at this injustice or grief at this loss -- exhibits right alignment to others and the world. Emotions are ways of "seeing-as" -- seeing this as threatening, that as delightful. Like beliefs, they change as cognitions change. We fear that bear, and if we learn it's stuffed, we revise our emotions. We are inescapably creatures for whom things matter. Perception of threat and its attendant fear link us to a world just as surely as perception of an oncoming car and its attendant belief (that impact is only seconds away) also link us to a world. The analogy encourages a coherence theory of emotional truth. We evaluate suspect emotions in light of others that are less so. Some are pliable or optional (delighting in a mathematical joke); others are more or less indispensable (aversion to callous infliction of pain) and define the relatively stable core of lives we can admire -- perhaps, what any truly human life must be.

The Stoic critique of emotion rests on the insight that deep care for persons, projects, and ideals necessarily make us vulnerable to suffering. In a world that at every turn puts the objects of our care at risk, we are made intensely vulnerable. Kierkegaard does not flinch from the fact that suffering is to be expected in any life infused with passionate concerns.

Chapters Five through Eight (Part II) enlist Kierkegaard as an historical corrective to the Stoic negative assessment of emotion. Furtak builds the case that emotions do not just cloud but can sharpen perception. Developing care for a friend positions us to see portions of her life that otherwise would be cognitively inaccessible. To be indifferent to gardening blocks us from knowledge of it. One who has been in love knows love, is perceptively attuned to it, in a way that is denied to those who have never loved. Emotion makes a human world intelligible. Right passion and right perception interweave. Wisdom judges what truly matters, and so must have access to what matters, access gained through care for what is worthy of our care.

Furtak relays a theme from Kierkegaard's Either/Or. An aesthete is unable to unify his perceptions of significance around a stable center; this makes him vulnerable to impulsive whim, emotional tumult, and affectless, fragmentary relationships. The absence of long-term emotional dispositions is the other side of emotional fragmentation, putting selfhood itself at risk. As Furtak interprets Kierkegaard, love is the obvious candidate for a fundamental emotional disposition that can center a self and ground more episodic but nevertheless central emotions (anger when love's object is threatened, hope for its restoration, delight in its presence, grief when it's lost … ).

Moral development overlaps with emotional development. Both sorts of development set a task, which raises the issue how emotion, perception and character can be subject to the will. As Furtak puts it, emotions often involve "an active cultivation of a passive mode of receptivity" (p. 8). We can work to master inordinate fear of strangers or misplaced disgust at a neighbor's habits by being open to alternative construals. We can work to be braver or more temperate or less afraid of expressing righteous offense. We can show readiness for such emotional and perceptual development by placing ourselves amongst others from whom we can learn to refine a moral vision and the moral traits connected to it. Moral status is not achieved easily or once-for-all. Furtak is surely right that the Judge in Either/Or II, despite being decked out as a paragon of civic virtue, nevertheless (as Kierkegaard himself slyly hints) has serious ethical shortcomings related to his truncated emotional development. For example, he's all too glib and casual in characterizing his relations to his wife and friend. As important, he's deaf (incredibly) to a register of rather central emotions. He's deaf to the emotional import of contingencies about which we might expect a person of his standing to feel some angst -- if not always, then sometimes. The possibility that he might lose his wife, or lose her affection, or lose public respect, or find himself at death's door, seems strangely beyond his ken. Perhaps he fears acknowledging the more painful emotions that enter any life we'd deem reflectively developed. To that extent, his emotional reach and integrity fall far short of a plausible ideal.

If emotional perception is a matter of seeing-as, then there's a place for moral imagination, a topic Furtak takes up in "The Romantic Imagination" (Chapter Eight). Part III contains chapters on love and necessary suffering as well as "Value on the Other Side of Nihilism" (Chapter Eleven) and "The Tragicomedy of Passionate Existence" (Chapter Twelve).

Emotions are naturally directed toward, and triggered by, things of great importance that we nevertheless can't control -- birth and death and historical place (including our given class, gender, language, and so forth). An emotional stance toward these unmasterable determinants of life can take on religious resonance. We may feel gratitude or regret at being born, but these emotions must seek a target of greater scope or power than whatever is subject to our will. A trust that love is not utterly lost even amidst devastation will read like a religious trust in whatever lies beyond our starkly finite place. A full commitment to love takes on a height or depth that can steel it against affliction, or at least mitigate the worst despair. Love then appears not as a self-fabricated condition but as a gift or blessing -- as in our bright welcome of the delightful exuberance of a child. Of course the responsive emotions of awe or gratitude, of grief or great delight or love, needn't be given a religious articulation: but they are natural candidates for one.

Kierkegaard writes of the biblical Job's loss of all he cherished and its sudden restoration. To find his suffering sufferable, Job must find strength to affirm his world, even if only in the hope, trust, or faith it will be restored. Furtak explores the fragile moments when love slips away and then seems to wondrously return. He takes over Kierkegaard's term of art, repetition, to frame this flux of loss, affirmation and hope for life-essential love. When the passional root of significance is severed, nourishment is lost: we are bereft. Reconnection with restorative love might take a Platonic path backward in time to grasp a "recollected" love as an inspiriting "eternal source." Alternatively, with Kierkegaard, we might anticipate a future restoration of love. He calls this gift "repetition" -- the Danish is close to the cinematic "second-take" -- wherein requited meaning appears as blessing, something we can hopefully anticipate, but not attain either through effort or study or manipulative technique -- and just as surely, not expect as due us as a matter of course.

As Kierkegaard has it, love can't be retrieved by hapless staring hard at the world, or, more plausibly, by looking for its glimmer, Proust-like, in the depths of memory. Furtak gives gentle endorsement to this religious construal of love as gift, affirming the ever-open possibility of love, the restoration, as it were, of a faith in love. Rorty wonders if belief in secular democratic institutions needs to be backed by a "fuzzy overlap of faith, hope and love," while Furtak affirms a non-fuzzy belief in hope and love that bolsters personal morale in the face of inevitable loss and threats of nihilism. This means being receptive toward the very idea of a credible articulation of faith that exceeds the sort of warrants that are due beliefs about the world; it means actually entering the tangled terrain where perceptions and convictions regarding concern and love reside and await reception and endorsement; and it means, finally, actually doing what we can to assimilate to our very being the wisdom in our loves.

This book is an original contribution to moral philosophy and to that part of the philosophy of mind dealing with the emotions. Its markedly felicitous style makes it readable Ð and graspable -- by undergraduates, even as it will reward philosophers who are specialists in moral psychology, Greek Philosophy, Kierkegaard, or 19th Century Post-Kantian thought. It displays an exemplary command of secondary and primary sources, and offers a veritable treasure trove in footnotes.