Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty

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Komarine Romdenh-Romluc (ed.), Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty, Routledge, 2017, 178pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415625128.


Reviewed by Jack Reynolds, Deakin University


Few would dispute that two of the great philosophers of the twentieth century were Ludwig Wittgenstein and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, despite their lives both being cut short. In this new edited collection, we are presented with eight quality papers that grapple with their philosophical relations, touching indirectly on issues relating to the analytic and continental/phenomenological movements that they have both been associated with. They address a wide variety of topics, including Gestalt psychology, expression, "mind-reading" and perception of other people, social and political philosophy (conservative or otherwise), solipsism and the first-person perspective, painting and vision, linguistic and perceptual indeterminacy, naturalism, and knowledge and certainty. The essays are written by some of the best scholars in the field, including Romdenh-Romluc herself, as well as Katherine Morris, Kathleen Lennon, Søren Overgaard, Chantal Bax, Taylor Carman, David Cerbone, and Tom Baldwin. All papers are of high-quality and make important contributions to their fields. In the review that follows, however, I will focus on some of those papers that especially piqued my interest and provide a prism through which to consider the volume as a whole.


Romdenh-Romluc's paper presents an interesting account of phenomenological solipsism, exploring Wittgenstein's famous remarks about this in the Tractatus, but also opening up a phenomenological aspect to this that she argues can be found in his writings and also in Merleau-Ponty's work despite his apparently thorough-going insistence on inter-subjectivity, inter-corporeity, and sociality. I think she is broadly right, and would only emphasise that it seems especially true of a phenomenology of reflective life. But if, as many existential phenomenologists hold, pre-reflective consciousness has a kind of priority in embodied action in which we are "with" our bodies, is this still the case at this level? Here, there is peculiar access to such experiences qua "lived", and in an "adverbial" manner as Romdenh-Romluc argues in this chapter (and elsewhere), but to describe them as solipsistic seems rather too theoretical, perhaps even a philosophical construction that is indebted to a certain sort of Cartesianism about mental states that remains powerful in our philosophical culture (e.g. the "reef of solipsism" that Sartre laments in Being and Nothingness). There is, rather, a kind of pre-personal anonymity at this level, which is always presupposed by reflection. While the world and I are structurally coupled or "co-constituted" on this view, this perspective is not "owned" by me, nor is it "subjective" in any standard sense that warrants the name solipsistic. Or to put it differently, if we want to hold that such a view is solipsistic or idealistic (as Baldwin contends in his essay), it is not given phenomenologically as such on the pre-reflective level of experience. The embodied account that Merleau-Ponty offers is therefore quite different from that held by Wittgenstein, despite some enigmatic and interesting remarks from him about the body being the best picture of the soul. Romdenh-Romluc's chapter helpfully highlights some of these differences.


Cerbone's contribution explores the linguistic and broader philosophical account of indeterminacy that can be found in both Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty, and commends it in comparison with the view of language and experience found in Quine. Of course, any advocate of indeterminacy pushes against our profession's particular emphasis upon the clear and distinct, and Cerbone's insightful chapter left me wondering about a remark by Thomas Hurka that was explicitly targeted at Wittgenstein, but which would also seem to include Merleau-Ponty, as well as Cerbone's juxtaposition of these thinkers. While Hurka's focus is on Wittgenstein's ethics, he rebukes anti-theoretical positions in a more general way that appears to include linguistic indeterminacy: an anti-theoretical position, Hurka argues, "is properly open only to those who have made a serious effort to theorise a given domain and found that it cannot succeed."[1] Without this initial effort, Hurka suggests that anti-theoretical philosophers are just being lazy, but, on Cerbone's telling, this is a strength of Merleau-Ponty's and Wittgenstein's philosophies of language, rather than a weakness. As an aside, some related ideas are also fruitfully explored in Andrew Inkpin's Disclosing the World (MIT 2016), which makes a related case in book-length detail. Claude Romano's At the Heart of Reason (Northwestern 2016) is another important contribution in this vein, and both of these authors also draw substantially on Merleau-Ponty and Wittgenstein. In that sense, this essay contribute to a renaissance of approaches to language that embrace indeterminacy, and which acknowledge that we can be tempted to think and talk in metaphysical ways without making any serious effort to develop a "theory" in the sense of a system of metaphysics.[2]


Overgaard offers some important objections to many of the too-quick renderings of certain declarations found in the work of Merleau-Ponty and Wittgenstein regarding our capacity to directly perceive (in at least some cases) the emotional states or intentions of other people. Remarks from Wittgenstein like "I do not surmise fear in him" and "We see emotion" are often marshalled against theoretical or intellectualist constructions that have a "mind-reading" focus, and in which some kind of theoretical inference or imaginative simulation is held to be required for us to understand the mental states of others. These simulations, representations and inferences might be held to be either conscious or unconscious processes.


Overgaard's general cautionary note here is well-founded. Claims that we can directly perceive the particular mental states of others are flattening and (to invoke Hurka, again) philosophically lazy, if they entail that there is no philosophical problem, or if their proponent fails to see that a dissolution/solution to one aspect of the problem of other minds (conceptual, say) does not automatically solve the epistemic problem or the more psychological/cognitive questions of interest to psychologists and empirically-minded philosophers. While Overgaard seems to agree that the "imperceptibility of other minds thesis" is likely false, he contends that there is a remaining question regarding how we come to recognise visible expressions (e.g. anger) as another's mental state. Answering that question leaves room for inferentialist or mind-reading accounts, even in the midst of a commitment to a thesis of direct social perception of emotions/intentions of the sort that characterises both Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty.


Overgaard emphasises that Merleau-Ponty was alert to this, but he argues that, at least in his negative remarks about TT (Theory Theory) and ST (Simulation Theory), Shaun Gallagher makes this mistake and falls victim to what Overgaard calls the "myth of the given mind." To repeat, the myth would be to hold that, because we might be thought to directly perceive at least some of the emotions and intentions of others, questions about how we acquire this knowledge/capacity, and how we come to recognise what we directly see as a mental state, are thereby rendered beside the point. I am not sure Gallagher does make this mistake, despite some of the suggestive quotes from his work that Overgaard marshals against him, but which need to be read in the context of his work more generally. (Overgaard notes this about Gallagher's broader body of work, but I think this point needs to be made in the dialectical context of Gallagher's criticisms of TT and ST too.)


Firstly, Gallagher doesn't take the phenomenology alone (e.g. that we seem to perceive rather than consciously infer the anger of our sporting opponent when they gesture angrily at a referee/umpire) to directly rule out or even undermine the still dominant TT and ST approaches, except insofar as these very theories draw on considerations that are (proto) phenomenological regarding, say, the first-personal experiences of observation, interpretation, perception, etc. As such, Gallagher's criticisms of these approaches is often dialectical and about their own (alleged) theoretical inconsistencies.


Secondly, Gallagher also examines an array of empirical literature, especially from developmental psychology but also neuro-psychology (e.g. early neonatal imitation and play, ostensible cross-cultural recognition of certain basic emotions, considerations to do with eye-tracking and time of response, etc.), and concludes that there is significant evidence supporting (or at least compatible with) alternative philosophical interpretations of much of the psychological and cognitive science drawn on by supporters of TT and ST (and hybrid options). He also does important work (e.g. in Gallagher and Varga 2014,[3] and in his latest monograph, which is about to be released) to show how perception may be sufficiently "smart" as to at least sometimes be able to directly perceive mental states. Gallagher's view, then, as well as the status of his objections to TT and ST, appear best characterised as an inference to the best explanation rather than a strict deduction of the kind presented by Overgaard and admittedly sometimes indicated by Gallagher's own critical remarks about TT and ST.


Finally, while we should more consistently make the distinctions that Overgaard calls for, I think it is too strong to say that "rejecting the imperceptibility thesis gets us precisely nowhere when it comes to marginalising (or rendering irrelevant) TT and ST accounts of mind-reading" (61). Rejecting the thesis that other minds are "hidden" or necessarily "imperceptible" may leave room for meta-level considerations in which we develop a capacity to recognise that anger is a mental state, thus potentially preserving an ongoing role for the mind-reading accounts provided by TT and ST and hybrid versions. But any rejection of the imperceptibility thesis nonetheless opens up new research questions and it changes the explanatory burden. It offers a different theoretical synthesis of the significant data that we already have, which may or may not over time prove to have greater explanatory power and efficacy than TT and ST, enabling different sorts of experiments and asking us to place greater epistemic weight on some experiments and scientific findings rather than others.


I turn next to Baldwin's essay on certainty and knowledge. One of the marks of many (all?) great philosophers is that their work has a fertile ambiguity about it, as Karl Ameriks has noted in regard to Kant. Indeed, at one point Merleau-Ponty defines the philosopher as someone who has a taste for evidence, and, at the same time, for ambiguity. This latter feature is perhaps especially obvious in the work of the late Wittgenstein, given the style of composition of the Investigations, both in part 1 and part 2. It is also characteristic of Merleau-Ponty, whose work, including the Phenomenology of Perception, continues to engender a multitude of interpretations, many of them explored recently in an issue of Continental Philosophy Review guest-edited by Andrew Inkpin and myself (vol. 50, 2017). In particular, these concern Merleau-Ponty's commitment (or otherwise) to transcendental phenomenology, and his sustained engagement with empirical sciences (on an apparently level playing-field) that seems to deny the methodological autonomy of both philosophy and science.


As such, I can certainly see where Baldwin's chapter is coming from, since it contains a particular interpretation of Merleau-Ponty's work on both of these issues. But I nonetheless want to resist Baldwin's interpretation, which basically commends Wittgenstein's naturalism and bemoans the absence of any such commitment in Merleau-Ponty. Indeed, on balance and notwithstanding the fertile ambiguity of the thinkers in question, I would offer the opposite diagnosis, with some cautions and caveats to follow.


The evidence for Wittgenstein's naturalism presented by Baldwin is fairly minimal. It is primarily some (typically) non-committal remarks on the natural history of human beings from Investigations. It sits uneasily with an array of other remarks from the Investigations and from some central commitments of the ordinary language philosophy that Wittgenstein (with Ryle) inaugurated and pursued, in at least some fashion. What, by contrast, is Baldwin's evidence for Merleau-Ponty's non-naturalism? Some admittedly curious remarks in Structure of Behaviour that hold that "perception is not an event in nature," supplemented by a transcendental idealist reading of aspects of the rest of his oeuvre, despite the deep and serious engagement with science that obtains throughout his career. This is old terrain for Baldwin, prosecuted previously.[4]


Before returning to the question of how to best interpret Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, however, let us try to first get clear regarding what naturalism is. Even if we want to contest the doctrinal or theoretical construal of naturalism (à la David Macarthur and Mario De Caro's "liberal naturalism"), it is the orthodoxy so let's begin with that. Naturalism usually involves both an ontological commitment (the furniture of the world is just those entities/processes/structures postulated by our best sciences) and an epistemic or methodological claim (the only veridical/reliable way of garnering knowledge is through scientific methods, generally understood in terms of certain privileged natural sciences).


Presented thus, both Merleau-Ponty and Wittgenstein are on the same team. They are non-naturalists, arguing against scientism and scientific naturalism, which is akin to what Merleau-Ponty calls the prejudice of objectivism. But naturalism need not be understood so restrictively. Other definitions might just hold that philosophical results are constrained by scientific results, or that they should be consistent with well-established science. If such a view includes the findings of future sciences, then an ongoing role for speculative philosophy is potentially preserved too (it is contested whether or not any constraints go the other way, from the philosophy to the science, but this is not ruled out).


On any such weaker view of methodological naturalism, however, it appears to be Merleau-Ponty, not Wittgenstein, who qualifies (for this interpretation of Merleau-Ponty, see chapter 4 in my Phenomenology, Naturalism and Science, Routledge 2017). Are philosophical results constrained by scientific ones for him? Arguably many of his key innovations in Phenomenology depend on Gestalt psychology, today having new life courtesy of 4E cognition and an interdisciplinary focus on phenomenology of embodiment and relevant sciences. While Merleau-Ponty's The Structure of Behaviour does appear to pre-emptively dismiss a physiological analysis of perception (e.g. 92-3) as Baldwin notes, and the second page of his famous 'Preface' to Phenomenology of Perception includes some fairly traditional remarks about science that could be found in the work of most classical phenomenologists, they sit uneasily with the style and depth of engagement with science that occurs thereafter in the Phenomenology (and much of the rest of his oeuvre).


Indeed, consider again the claims that Baldwin criticises concerning perception not being an event in nature. Merleau-Ponty proffers them in the context of claiming that the universe of naturalism has not been able to be self-enclosed. In contemporary parlance, he thus appears to contest claims concerning the causal closure of the physical, and any thesis regarding the unity of science and thus the potentially reductive treatment of one field to others that are allegedly more basic. Perhaps Merleau'Ponty even embraces a version of emergentism regarding the interaction between brain, body and environment. This may be problematic, but his claims are developed at least partly by taking the findings of various sciences seriously. As such, it is more charitable to construe his argument as contending that perception cannot be adequately understood on reductive versions of naturalism (e.g. scientific naturalism, naturalism that aims for global reductions, or naturalism that subscribes to "strong" rather than liberal forms of both ontological and methodological naturalism). But not all sciences are attached to such programs. Indeed, they are often either agnostic or more pragmatic about such metaphysical matters.


At bottom, the problem is that Baldwin maps the predicative/pre-predicative distinction onto an objective/subjective distinction (161). This means that Merleau-Ponty is thus argued to give priority to subjective experiences, and we are then to derive the "idealist" picture that Baldwin criticises. But we can contest each of these associations, which appear to accept the terms of the debate that Merleau-Ponty's philosophy is trying to disrupt, as both Morris's and Romdenh-Romluc's essays also emphasise. Perception is more prepersonal than personal or subjective for Merleau-Ponty; perspectival but not first-personal at its most basic, deriving from an animal and environmental system or milieu. To call this transcendental idealism, as Baldwin does, also means that a lot of 4E cognition and ecological accounts are likewise idealist. Perhaps that is the correct conclusion, but it seems to be based on its own prior metaphysics, a metaphysics of objective thought, e.g., scientific naturalism. And whatever one's judgements about such a metaphysics, it seems to me that it is neither Wittgenstein's nor Merleau-Ponty's.

[1]T. Hurka, “Normative Ethics: Back to the Future,” The Future for Philosophy. ed. B Leiter, Oxford University Press 2004, 246-64.

[2] Thanks to David Macarthur for pointing this out (see his “Metaphysical Quietism and Everyday Life,” Cambridge Companion to Philosophical Methodology, eds. G. D’Oro and S. Overgaard, Cambridge University Press 2017, 229-248).

[3] S. Gallagher and S. Varga, "Social Constraints on the Direct Perception of Emotions and Intentions," Topoi 33(1), 2014, 185-199.

[4] E.g., T. Baldwin, "Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenological Critique of Natural Science," Phenomenology and Naturalism, eds. H. Carel and D. Meacham, Cambridge University Press 2013, 189-219.