Wittgenstein and Natural Religion

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Gordon Graham, Wittgenstein and Natural Religion, Oxford University Press, 2014, 219pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713975.

Reviewed by Mark Bernier, Azusa Pacific University


In this book, Gordon Graham attempts to breathe new life into an old idea, namely, a naturalized conception of religion; with this goal, he succeeds admirably. As the title suggests, the work is something of an intersection between two separate investigations -- Wittgenstein and religion -- and the work may have benefited from a more focused approach on the latter, rather than the former. Graham's discussion, with respect to the nature of religion, is insightful and engaging, providing a necessary and timely corrective to viewing philosophy of religion narrowly, as primarily concerned with epistemic issues or metaphysical speculations. To naturalize the concept of religion, as Graham attempts to do, is to resist this move and to raise questions of its value and how it connects to the human condition. It is in this that we find its real worth (rather than merely in the reflections on Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion). Graham provides us with a range of sources to consider; in effect, he draws from the historical context in order to challenge the current parameters of philosophy of religion. In this, the book is well worth reading. In other ways, however, the work either does not go far enough or focuses overlong on issues that could have been condensed or passed over. Nonetheless, this work provides thoughtful reflection on the nature of religion, as it seeks to carve out an intriguing space between religion that emerges from the framework of metaphysical theology and religion stripped of supernatural raiment. It is Graham's move to fill this space that recommends the book.

There are nine chapters, with roughly the first half devoted to an examination of Wittgenstein's philosophical approach, central concepts, and "Wittgensteinian Fideism." Graham devotes the second half to expanding on and defending his own account of natural religion. He is right to point out that Wittgenstein's influence on philosophy of religion has been in decline, and with this in mind, one may wonder if his focus on Wittgenstein is justified. But Graham is generally on solid footing here. He claims: "My main aim in this book is to argue that Wittgenstein's philosophical endeavors can be made to throw light on religion" in a way that avoids reducing religion to "laughable epistemic standards" so characteristic of the typical "Wittgensteinian" approach to philosophy of religion (150). Graham thus attempts to reveal the nature of "true religion" partly through the use of Wittgenstein's approach to philosophy in general, rather than pursuing the (perhaps bankrupt) program set by "Wittgensteinian Fideists" (characteristically associated with D.Z. Phillips, Norman Malcolm, and others).

With this in mind, Graham's primary task is to resurrect (not invent) the concept of "true religion." "True religion," Graham claims, is "a natural propensity" that concerns our relation to the universe, realized in certain practices and attitudes (153). To develop his account, he leans heavily on a well-considered mix of thinkers, who stand in some tension with one another with respect to religious beliefs yet have similar insights on the nature of religion itself -- for example, Hume and Reid, Kant, Schleiermacher, William James, John Stuart Mill, Jonathan Edwards, Adam Smith, as well as lesser known thinkers such as Henry Scougal. Hume's distinction between religion's "foundation in reason, and that concerning its origin in human nature" frames the discussion (1). Relying on Hume, Graham distinguishes between philosophical theology and philosophy of religion, where philosophy of religion has "the further task" of critically understanding the proper place of religion "in a flourishing human life" (10). This task involves rethinking the nature of philosophy of religion, and it is important to realize Graham is not arguing for any particular religion -- his claim is that the religious impulse is basic to human nature and experience and its expression important for human flourishing. To this end, he borrows a number of key insights from Schleiermacher with respect to the nature of religion -- following Schleiermacher, he seeks to avoid reducing religion either to metaphysics, ethics, or belief, while also avoiding a purely naturalistic conclusion. His positive account of religion also follows Schleiermacher: that religion arises from an "intuition of the infinite," which gives rise to (an existential) concern over our relation with eternity or the universe (i.e., what we cannot grasp or control and yet stand in relation to). His primary target is thus not simply the concept of religion but the religious life. So conceived, religion is a "mode of activity" of human life, characterized primarily through the practice of worship and use of ritual, through a sense of the sacred (176). The analysis of these activities and experiences then become extremely important (and his account stands or falls on this). In short, the essence of religion is located in the practical (though not the ethical) rather than the theoretical pursuits distinguishing so much contemporary philosophy of religion.

It is precisely this disconnect with the contemporary landscape of philosophy of religion that justifies Graham's focus on Wittgenstein. And this is why Graham invests half of the book to an examination of his contribution to religious thought -- since in Wittgenstein, Graham identifies an approach to religion that is neither dismissive nor hostile, but reverent, while still maintaining objectivity. Graham's return to the notion of "true religion" requires a new approach to philosophy of religion, which involves a different toolset apart from the usual approach we see with, say, Alvin Plantinga or Richard Swinburne. As Graham puts it:

Wittgenstein's interest in the empirical study of religion can serve to switch our attention beyond the almost obsessive focus on religious belief and language that has been such a marked feature of contemporary philosophy of religion, and focus instead on the nature of religious experience and practice (31).

Graham first focuses on dismantling the historical narrative behind the rise of "Wittgensteinian Fideism," since "Wittgenstein's philosophy of religion" has already been "exhaustively discussed" to the point that it is "necessary to spend some time considering, and providing grounds for rejecting" certain attitudes that have become entrenched about Wittgenstein (16). He concludes that Wittgensteinian Fideism is built on a "house of cards" (45). According to Graham, it almost certainly involves the erroneous application of Wittgenstein's concepts (language game, forms of life, etc.) in philosophy of religion. He convincingly shows that Wittgensteinian Fideism is based on little more than a scattering of autobiographical asides (from those who knew and discussed religion with Wittgenstein), provocative though inconclusive comments made by Wittgenstein, and the appropriation of central Wittgensteinian concepts to religion -- a house of cards, indeed. This is a significant, though not entirely novel, nor unwelcome, conclusion; Wittgensteinians have held this view for quite some time. Graham does not seem to break much new ground here, and his treatment appears overlong, focusing on interpretive issues rather than (what seems to be) the primary end of the book -- namely, the articulation of a notion of religion that broadens the very manner in which philosophy of religion is approached. However, he does manage to free Wittgenstein from the baggage of fideism, which in turn allows him the leeway to put Wittgenstein to other tasks in the investigation of religion. The point, however, could have been reinforced by including (for example) more of a discussion of fideism itself and how fideism is (in its way) a response to the emphasis on metaphysical and epistemological concerns in philosophy of religion. This would have helped to indicate what is at stake in the larger picture, beyond the "in house" debate over Wittgenstein's position in philosophy of religion -- and this would have served better to locate Graham's conclusion about religion as more than a mere corrective to "Wittgensteinian Fideism," to see natural religion more clearly as a corrective to philosophy of religion in general. For this, I gather, is what Graham aims to achieve.

Graham argues against some common interpretations associated with Wittgensteinian Fideism. For example, he claims "religious language" is not a "language game" since a "language game" involves more than learning to use words: "With the concept of 'language game,' Wittgenstein is drawing attention to different kinds of linguistic actions, not distinctive vocabularies" (40, emphasis original). This interpretation runs into some possible textual problems (Graham does qualify it with a footnote), but it is certainly plausible. Furthermore, Graham sees a similar misapplication of the notion of "forms of life" to religion (42). Thus, religion is not a "form of life" in the sense given by Hans-Johann Glock, as an "intertwining of culture, world view and language" (43). What Wittgenstein has in mind, according to Graham, is more in line with Hutcheson's "natural sociability" that is deeply embedded in the sort of creature we are, incorporating ubiquitous and common activities such as eating, drinking, friendship, raising children, and so forth, that point to the most basic understanding of a shared form of life (which is not reducible to biology or cultural determinations) (44). Graham makes a similar case for seeing theology as grammar (47-54). Thus, he seeks to place action at the center of religion, rather than (say) the notion of "groundless belief" endorsed by Malcolm, where religious beliefs are based on a "Reidian-type intuitionism, or anti-foundationalism" (70).

What we make of this partly depends upon how we see Graham's project. If we see the book mainly as a contribution to Wittgenstein scholarship, then perhaps it does not adequately deal with these issues. But if (and this is how he should be read) we see the project as primarily influenced and inspired by Wittgenstein, then we can readily appreciate the achievement. Yet, this illuminates a tension in the book between these two projects. Graham does a very good job integrating them, though perhaps due to what he aims to achieve, there is still a sense that there are two different programs, and the analysis of "true religion" could have received more attention.

The second half of the book turns fully to an examination of religion, and his discussion here is excellent. True religion is "a way of being in the world," not "a system of thought about the world" (151, emphasis original). It involves certain practices that are "built into" our condition and nature. Thus, to understand religion we must understand religious activity and how this is anchored in human nature. Following Schleiermacher, Graham locates this primarily in the sense we have of our relation to the universe (153). His development of this view is perhaps the most important part of the book, and it involves his discussion of the "sense of the sacred." Is there, he asks, a religious sensibility, a "sense of the sacred" connected with "the meaning and value of a human life?" (112) Graham approaches the question in the following manner. First, he pushes against a view to which we easily succumb, that a human is a Cartesian/Humean subject, a passive observer, an audience member, who primarily experiences or perceives the world -- instead, we are fundamentally agents, actors who essentially act. Second, one of the defining features of human activity is that our actions realize and convey meaning -- symbolism, but also performances, which realize certain values and shape our lives. Such meaningful actions form the core of his understanding of religion.

Note that Graham walks an interesting line between naturalistic reduction and supernatural commitment. He doesn't argue that we experience a supernatural reality. This would obviously risk committing him to a metaphysical (supernatural) view of religion, which is precisely what he attempts to avoid (after all, he is constructing a natural account of religion). Thus, he isn't claiming (for example) that there is a sensus divinitatis (the concept revived by Plantinga); rather, he seeks to ground this "intuition" in our natural, shared judgments and experiences. In order to carve out this space, he relies on Schleiermacher's insight that religion is based on an "'intuition' of the infinite" -- thus, Graham claims: "To know that our lives are bounded in time and space is necessarily to 'intuit' the existence of something not so bounded -- eternity and the universe" (156, emphasis original). This "intuition" is flanked by two attitudes Graham rejects: Protagorean humanism that denies there is anything beyond the boundaries of our lives and experience and primitive superstition that fails to honor the distinction between the finite and infinite by trying "to encompass the infinite within the boundary of everyday life" as a "magical" power we can access (156).

This "intuition of the infinite," however, gives rise to what could be called anxiety -- "a universe infinite in both space and time seems necessarily indifferent to even our highest moral goals and our greatest artistic accomplishments" (155). What we naturally pursue is purpose, significance, yet this is precisely what seems uncertain to those who have a developed sense of the "natural intuition." And it is this sense of the relation between humanity and an indifferent, infinite universe that brings us to Graham's view of religious actions and the creation of sacred spaces. Such a space is created through human activity that draws together the finite and the infinite -- the purpose is to become "one with the infinite in the midst of the finite" (157). It is to appropriate, and thus experience, the infinite through the finite by creating a space in which the two can be brought together in our experience.

This act of appropriation is most distinctly realized in the practice of worship, where "human action transcends space and time by means of rituals whose meaning is communicated in symbol, and in which the sacrifice of value transforms objects, opportunities, and people into sacraments" (176). Graham's analysis, thus, turns to rituals and symbols to show how they are used to create a sacred space. What Graham has in mind are not actions meant to cause a supernatural change (like witchcraft) but rather acts of worship that realize a gestalt shift, as with the duck-rabbit: nothing in experience has changed, yet the entire picture has changed (156-7). Of course, not everyone can see the shift. One may hear sound but not music; one may see color but not the painting; one may even hear music but not hear either its excellence or faults. This helps to illustrate the "sense of the sacred" that is part of the religious life. Not everyone has a good musical ear or a sense of beauty -- just so, not everyone will have a developed sense of the sacred. In the same way that a handshake is the welcome, worship is in the action (163-4). Ritual and symbol (the elements of worship) communicate what "can neither be conveyed by words nor replaced by personal experience" (169). One who does not have the proper sensibility may "only reveal a lack of sensibility to an important aspect of human life" (163).

Graham's discussion ranges over a number of important issues, and his treatment at times may appear to move too quickly. A more direct comparison with other competing views may have been helpful -- for example, with other accounts of religion that emphasize faith or belief, or with Howard Wettstein's The Significance of Religious Experience, which also attempts to carve out a similar space for naturalized religion. Such comparisons could have been constructive. Finally, the connection between religion and human flourishing is left a bit underdeveloped.

In the final analysis, these are minor issues, and there is a great deal to commend Graham's book. He provides a compelling picture of natural religion that is well worth following.