Wittgenstein and Other Minds: Rethinking Subjectivity and Intersubjectivity with Wittgenstein, Levinas, and Husserl

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Søren Overgaard, Wittgenstein and Other Minds: Rethinking Subjectivity and Intersubjectivity with Wittgenstein, Levinas, and Husserl, Routledge, 2007, 201pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415955935.

Reviewed by Bettina Bergo, Université de Montréal


Søren Overgaard's Wittgenstein and Other Minds (WM) makes two interesting contributions to the Wittgenstein literature. First, it approaches contemporary debates about the problem of "other minds" (WM 2) as a conceptual and ontological problem -- viz., how we conceive of mind in the first place[1] (before turning to determinations concerning the minds of others). It also extends that question to ethics, since the way in which we pose the question of other minds, or subjects, frequently concerns what behaviors are appropriate to adopt in regard to those others. This is notably the case when questions of human well being, or suffering, arise. Overgaard's second contribution is his lucid reading of the middle and later Wittgenstein, including a close examination of the philosopher's posthumous Last Writings on the Philosophy of Psychology. Overgaard follows Wittgenstein's "problems" approach to other minds in light of concerns that prove irreducibly ethical. The author's conviction, which he demonstrates systematically, is that the later Wittgenstein does indeed help us "to think differently about the issue at hand," which he terms "intersubjectivity,"[2] thereby displacing it from rigidly epistemological frameworks. Showing the importance of Wittgenstein's thought for ethical questions also means reading him rightly, and that requires navigating past four potential dangers. The first argues that Wittgenstein's "community account" or social conception of mind evacuates most, if not all, dimensions of subjectivity in favor of a pre-existing social context. The second danger lies in the claim that, in Wittgenstein, the very idea of a subject, present differently to itself than it is to others, is eliminated.

Both dangers, the individualist versus the anti-individualist, and the immanentist versus the anti-immanentist one, are exaggerations of Wittgenstein's own arguments and weaken the claims he makes for a social understanding of mind, against an inaccessible or sequestered immanence. What Overgaard proposes to do, by way of elucidation, is to reopen the problem of solipsism as it arose in debates about intentionality. He then traces Heidegger's and Sartre's criticisms of Husserlian intentionality and indicates, finally, how Levinas's conception of the asymmetrical call coming from the Other supplements both Husserl's and Sartre's rather solipsistic "intersubjectivity." Overgaard concludes that, taken together, Sartre and Levinas give us a way past solipsism that resonates with significant concerns of the later Wittgenstein, writing on philosophical psychology. To be sure -- and unlike these "continental" philosophers -- Wittgenstein was concerned with the grammar operative in ethical language games, as in the asymmetry between first and third person statements.

Two related dangers include recent versions of Cartesian dualism, which protect the claim for a certain transcendence of other minds (understood as beetles in boxes or as opaque "solids"), and the behaviorist reading of Wittgenstein, which argues for the perspicuity of mental activity through our actions. Overgaard argues against both of these, with the salutary goal of establishing mediations between them. It cannot be the case that another person is present to us in the way an object might be. Nevertheless, as he argues, it is implausible to hold that certain dimensions of another's experience do not, at times, escape our perception and understanding. How then can we bring the two positions closer together? First, by diminishing the scope of other minds skepticism (WM, 5). To do so, Overgaard demonstrates that a self wholly grown up in a complexus of worlds can never be reduced to a black box. He draws his approach to being-in-the-world from Heidegger, thereby problematizing Husserl's more solipsistic conception of intentionality. Further, the embodied self in-the-world is a self that is, verbally and expressively, accessible to others, to our knowledge -- but not simply through its behavior, because expression also entails that the other is one who is capable of "attending (and acting as the source of) the expressive manifestation" (WM, 8). Overgaard thus enters debates in the Wittgenstein literature, using arguments and concepts from key continental philosophers (Heidegger, Husserl, Sartre, and Levinas). I will shortly examine his observations on the confluences between Wittgenstein and Levinas. For now, however, let me briefly situate the work in a broader intellectual setting.

Wittgenstein and Other Minds belongs to a current of scholarship that is now reading the middle Wittgenstein along with his extensive writing on psychology together with phenomenology. This is ongoing in a number of institutional contexts including the Center for Subjectivity Research (Denmark) and, less well known to English-speaking scholars, Jocelyn Benoist's research group at the École Normale Supérieure, which collaborates with the Husserl Archives (Paris). Revisiting questions concerning the meaning of subjectivity, of perception, and of attention, is a concern for these scholars -- all of whom evince a subtlety of approach and refusal to return to a metaphysical or a merely sociological conception of subjects and worlds. Now, what makes Overgaard's book particularly valuable is the clear development of his arguments. These unfold as a discourse of problems, a "problematology," weaving divergent perspectives together where this casts light on Wittgenstein's sometimes opaque reflection on other minds. While Overgaard's concern is to show, ultimately, that neither solipsism nor the abandonment of a (moderate) externalism need be the price paid for preserving a certain inaccessibility of -- even a density to -- the other embodied and worldly mind, he does so without a particular agenda: the exploration of embodied subjectivity, as interactive and physical (evincing positions, "facing" with variable and unforeseeable expressions), points toward a bridge between the argument for limited access to other minds and the possibility of a "proto-ethics" not so far from Levinas's own concerns. By "proto-ethics" Overgaard means, like Levinas, that the question: "How to answer the other who looks at me?" arises spontaneously, and with particular acuity, when I perceive that the demand or claim being made entails distress, and asks for help. Overgaard is following Wittgenstein (and Stanley Cavell) here, arguing that the question of other minds is clarified insofar as it becomes a call "in the case of … 'acknowledging another's pain.'" Why so? "I know in a general way what I am called upon to do" (WM, 3) because, through expression, I accede to the other person in a direct, if not thoroughgoing way. With this claim, Overgaard stops; he does not sanction an integrally behaviorist approach to other minds, much less an ethics flowing from behaviorism. Indeed, it attests a certain self-discipline that he admits (as did Wittgenstein) to agnosticism in regard to what moral rules should flow from the concreteness and particularity of the encounters he, and Wittgenstein (cf. the latter's conversations with Waismann, inter alia), are discussing.

It is impossible and undesirable to recapitulate the impressive arguments advanced here, notably against beetles-in-boxes conceptions of subjectivity as an unfathomable (from outside) inner state. Nevertheless, it is worth pausing and noting some of them. As indicated, Overgaard does not shrink before antithetical readings of Wittgenstein. He explores the difficulties of intentionality and "internalism," as well as the strong externalist position of Gregory McCulloch (WM, 75-77). Here, his debt to Husserl is considerable, and fruitful, because it avoids psychologism while connecting his subjectivity with embodied movement. Against the ostensible enigma of intentionality (when understood as a kind of mental ray aimed at the world) -- including to some degree Husserl's noetic-noematic intentional unity, whose advantage was its dynamism -- Overgaard shows the links between the middle Wittgenstein's refusal of internalist and externalist speculation (in favor of a descriptive method) and Heidegger's Welterkenntnis, which is an ongoing involvement with the world and a "having" (BT, 79; WM, 43) that dissolves approaches to knowing as some "self-standing inner item" (WM, 41).[3]

It is, however, Overgaard's discussion of expression that provides the most convincing path beyond the solipsism-behaviorism dichotomy, while preserving the in-the-world, embodied grounds he distills from Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Sartre. Given the space available, I will turn directly to that discussion.

Overgaard sets out from the questions: How can we preserve the defensible intuition that "there exists a first-person perspective preserving privileged and irreducible characteristics [of mind]," without simultaneously upholding the claims of solipsism? And again: How do we attach accessibility to behavior without evacuating the specificity of the first-person perspective (where my direct experience of my own consciousness, like that of others, is not wholly translated into behavior)? In short, he adopts a path that combines Wittgenstein's arguments that "my first-person perspective … is my only point of access" (WM, 102) to others and to the world, with phenomenological descriptions of experience that demonstrate simultaneously the accessibility and transcendence of other minds. The path leads him through two philosophies specifically concerned with the transcendence of other minds, really, of other subjects: that of Sartre and that of Levinas. In so doing, Overgaard brings to light unexpected confluences between Wittgenstein's later thought and that, notably, of Levinas. I propose to look at the strategies Overgaard draws from Sartre, and then from Levinas, thanks to whom he gets past some dualistic dilemmas of other minds and private meaning.

Turning first to Sartre, Overgaard recapitulates some of the latter's famous vignettes (e.g., the voyeur inferring he is watched), which underscore the embedded quality of subjectivity and its unavoidable finitude as a living body. The vignettes evince Sartre's logical (and often disconcertingly abstract) agonism, because for Sartre a subject is fundamentally unable -- as a being "for-itself" -- not to objectify what is outside it: "the Other is still an object for me" (WM, 108), and remains so. Despite (or perhaps because of) its inspiration from a certain (Kojève) reading of Hegel's dialectics, Sartre's logic turns on the non-equivalence, and exclusivity, of subjects and objects (WM, 108). The Other is an object for me, although as such it can prove dangerous and unpredictable. Consequently, the transcendence of the Other outstrips my own (WM, 109), necessarily, and we find a certain exaggeration of the predatory quality of intersubjective relations. More distressing, the Other remains as abstract in Sartre's phenomenology as it was in Husserl's. The use and deployment of this abstraction differs between them, however. In Sartre, the immediacy of the encounter with an Other comes to pass, frequently, as an oblique gaze or a "rustling" occurring behind us. A host of examples thus point to intersubjective encounters that are largely missed, because the Other, while beyond my access, is logically and ontologically "primitive" or minimalist. Sartre calls this a "pre-numerical" Other (WM, 111). As such, that which preserves the transcendence of the Other simultaneously forecloses all access to his or her subjectivity. The Other is invariably an object. How then could I know he or she is also a subject? "Sartre himself admits that '[w]hat I apprehend immediately when I hear the branches crackling behind me is not that there is someone there; it is that I am vulnerable.'" Overgaard then inquires, "But then what justifies Sartre's immediate transition to the claim that 'I am seen'" (WM, 111) -- that is, seen by whom? In short, with Sartre, we have an intersubjectivity whose manifestations are embedded in a world and lay claim to concreteness. However, whether we proceed from the affects of fear or shame engendered in us by the Other's gaze, we have precious little with which to investigate the look of the Other as an appeal, or a real opening to interaction, much less to a degree of knowledge. It is precisely that resource that will be provided by Levinas. The latter's emphasis on the performative and pre-theoretical makes possible the rapprochement Overgaard sketches between Levinas and Wittgenstein.[4]

With Levinas, the face-to-face encounter is the social relation in its incunabula. The face, as expression, impacts me, not firstly from a third-person perspective, but according to a grammar or normativity that revolves around the first-person and the vocative case. Does the transcendence of the face proceed from its separation from manifestation, as it seemed to do in Sartre? This is a problem that Overgaard leaves open, short of attributing a formalistic alterity to Levinas as well. In the latter, as also in Wittgenstein, expression moves between manifestation and signification -- embodied affects signify.

We have with Levinas -- more so than with Sartre -- the rudiments of an intersubjectivity that is social and corrects the third-person intellectualism of Husserl's Other, who is above all an alter ego. While not without a certain formalism, Levinas's innovation consists in showing that the face affects me before intentionality fixes it sufficiently to segregate the object pole from the ego pole -- the source of my intentional aiming. By working out of Husserl's time consciousness investigations and observations on passive synthesis, Levinas grounded his arguments about intersubjective responsibility on the difference between the flowing time of phenomenological consciousness (i.e., time, like consciousness, flows continuously, preserving the position of events in its flowing-off) and the instantaneous, discreet quality of sensation as it wells up spontaneously in the body, before being recognized and "intentionalized" in the formal flow. This reading of the way in which consciousness comes to be as embodied, opens questions about sensibility as thinly normative, even before it becomes representation. Of course, sensibility and affectivity are not a different intelligibility, a different rationality. But they may point to a different root of action and interpersonal spontaneity. Overgaard does not explore at length the much debated modes in which "consciousness" might be interrupted (by itself, by its own affectivity, or by another "outside" or "inside"). He therefore avoids the question of how the largely unremarked flow of consciousness could be interrupted by an other-in-the-same, whose transcendence is nevertheless not compromised. He also does not discuss to what sort of language game the phenomenological attestation of Levinas's inter-subjective vulnerability belongs.

That does not mean, however, that he cannot find in Levinas a fleshly, incarnate being who, within its multiple worldly connections, is open to others at the level of its skin, i.e., through its specific sensibility. Overgaard understands clearly that Levinas has embraced the paradox: "the Other is a being 'both graspable [theorizable] and escaping every hold [impacting me at a passive, affective level]'." Yet this "living contradiction," as Levinas calls it, between a formal, theoretical Other and a concrete Other who is kath' auto, permits him to get around the sort of abstraction that bedeviled Sartre -- notably, of the Other as (my) object. Indeed, Levinas offers plausible arguments for the inevitability of the contradiction as, without it, "violence [toward an Other] would simply be labor" (WM, 117).[5] Hence the value of reading Levinas and Sartre in proximity to each other; we thereby grasp the connection between the demand carried by expressions of affect, notably suffering, and the violence that objectifies the Other as if it were a mere process of "labor." Indeed, it is in the midst of the discussion of expression and the possibility of objectifying the Other that Overgaard turns to Wittgenstein's own revision of the epistemology of others' affects (we should no longer say "states of mind," because expression is neither static nor a manifestation of something deeper or hidden from view). As expression, pain "stretches its arms out in many directions … plays many roles in publicly observable reality," and Wittgenstein insists that if we cut off these "external arms" of pain, "what we will be left with … will be so detached from our lives that it becomes hard to see how it could be what we mean when we talk about pain" (WM, 125). Working with a robust, multifaceted description of expression, we find an access to others that depends neither on extreme immanentism (beetles in boxes), nor on a radical behaviorism, in which what we know of the Other is available only as "mere behavior" (WM, 125).

This is why Chapter Seven, entitled "The Play of Expression," is said to be the pivotal one in the book. By underscoring the "living contradiction" that Levinas embraces, Overgaard shows progressively that, in matters of intersubjectivity, epistemic questions arise along with ontological critique (i.e., exploring what mind might be and how we are reifying it, whether in that of others or in our own) and "description" (Wittgenstein's own watchword here). "As Levinas says … the epiphany of the face is where '[p]henomenology can follow the reverting of thematization into ethics'" (WM, 117).[6] This "reverting" is not psychological regression. It does not proceed from some hypothetical, pre-cognitive state that would be like a mental "world behind the world" (WM, 121). Instead, it rejoins what Overgaard discerns in the later Wittgenstein as an existentialization of the other minds question (WM, 121). This surprising move is possible when we allow Wittgenstein to stand between claims for the absolute transcendence or inaccessibility of the Other, and a behavior-based access to his or her thoughts. The intermediary stance becomes quite clear in Wittgenstein's deliberations about pain (WM, 123). "That is to say: if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation', the object [sensation as lived] drops out of consideration as irrelevant (Philosophical Investigations §293)" (WM, 123).

One does need to move back into idealism to insist on the necessity of a grammar different from that of infinitive predication by which to approach human suffering and, therefore, an important dimension of other minds. "One can [even] be a hardnosed materialist and still think that pain (being nothing but C-fiber stimulation, say) is something 'inner' in the sense of being completely independent of any behavioral manifestation" (WM, 124). Inner, but never completely independent of manifestation. As Wittgenstein says, whatever our approach to pain, immanentism must be tied to some manifestation, lest we confront an absurd question like that which wonders "whether … flogging can really be used to punish people" (WM, 125-26). The descriptive, intersubjective approach to affects will take shape, here, through the dialogue with Levinas.

This dialogue is possible because, for Wittgenstein as for Levinas, the "bodily behavior of the other subject is itself … soaked in the meaning of mind" (WM, 128). While we should not assimilate mind to body, we can bring them closer by insisting that any "gap" between expression and mind violates the progress made by conceiving ourselves and others as multiply embedded in the world, and embodied to the point that there is no Ego "inhabiting my body." That argument only returns us to logics that insist that utterances, like expressions, "translate" some thought that preceded them, as if pre-formed. "But that which is in him, how can I see it? Between his experience and me there is always the expression! Here is the picture: He sees it immediately, I only mediately. But that is not the way it is. He doesn't see something and describe it to us" (WM, 131, emphasis added),[7] as Wittgenstein argues.

Without seeing "into" some mind-box that would already reify subjective life, we certainly do "see" affect in another person. It is not a quality perceived, nor the accident of a substance. It is part of an intersubjective dynamic. "Expression is essentially nonstatic," observes Overgaard (WM, 132). Moreover, the "play of expression is qualitatively different from the (endlessly variable) movements of objects in space" (WM, 132). Is this always so? Most likely not, and Levinas provides examples where a face couches itself in the play of traits whose seductiveness momentarily invites comparison with the packaging of products. That, however, is not at stake here, though it attests to the inevitable encroachment of Sartre's analyses of objectification into both Levinas's and Wittgenstein's more ethical accounts.

Expression, like embodiment, is not a thing. It never "just stands there" -- any more so than does mind (WM, 133). The complement of the world-embeddedness of body is the necessary manifestation (expression) affording access to others. Indeed, we could almost say that expression is mind, not some intermediary. Cutting across the third-person constitutions, by Husserl, of the Other who is my alter ego, who appears like me, expression is also a foil to access. As frankness and spontaneity, expression is precisely what makes deception and hiding meaningful. Without much thinking about it, we expect to have access to the Other's so-called mental life through the Other’s expressions. Where access is limited or disappointed, we encounter "uncertainties" that the later Wittgenstein qualified as "constitutional uncertainties," belonging to the rules of the (inter-subjective) game. This game consists in "experiencing others as others" (WM, 136). And we should bear in mind that, in the game of wondering what it is that I am actually feeling, my own "state of mind" can prove less directly accessible to me than the Other's. I am not unequivocally comparable to a tribunal, assessing the multitude of metaphoric plaintiffs and defendants I call my emotions. Either way, "the soul may be invisible to us the way something absolutely present may be invisible to us," as Overgaard observes (WM, 139).[8]

In this pivotal chapter, expression effects the rapprochement between Cartesian dualisms, arguing for the privilege of first-person utterances, and the behaviorism that would have it that the first person is but a deformation of third-person utterances. This debate is not simply patched over by Overgaard. Its multiple pitfalls and limitations are clearly shown. Recently, one sensitive commentator of Wittgenstein, Vincent Descombes, resorted to the grammar of utterances of belief to reach a more decisively externalist conclusion. Since it can be shown that an utterance of belief in the first person is not an attribution (not even as an utterance that attributed belief to someone who turned out to be "me"), he argued, it should then follow that "there is no difference between the discourse of consciousness and the discourse of self-consciousness."[9] Therefore, nothing ultimately corresponds to what we call "self-consciousness." Other French philosophers, like Jocelyn Benoist, have contested this claim in favor of a position surprisingly similar to Overgaard's: as responses, first-person utterances of belief have this difference with regard to third person utterances; viz., they bring the speaker in, if not as the guarantor of his or her claim, then at least as one "stepping forth" to answer. The speaker is thus "positioned" by the assertion "as problematical," a problematical subject. Overgaard opened his discussion by adopting Anita Avramides's argument that the problem of other minds is, firstly, a "question about what the mind is" (WM, 2). As such, the question concerns other minds as much as minds tout court, expressed in utterances not reducible to third-person ones. These contemporary arguments were anticipated by Wittgenstein's remarks to Friedrich Waismann, inter alia. He there observes, succinctly, "At the end of my lecture on ethics I spoke in the first person: I think that this is something very essential. Here, there is nothing to be stated anymore; all I can do is to step forth as an individual and speak" (WM, 150). Clearly, the distance between the two types of utterances in question, and their respective language games, opens the space in which a middle path between self-enclosed immanentism and exaggerated externalism may be glimpsed. Here, too, in the resemblances between Levinas and Wittgenstein, and the ongoing debate about subjectivity and minds, we see epistemology and description as if "reverting from thematization to ethics."

[1] For his initial approach to the question, Overgaard is indebted to Anita Avramides, Other Minds (London: Routledge, 2001).

[2] "The theme of inter-subjectivity, or other minds, construed broadly in the way indicated, is the main topic of this book," WM, 5.

[3] The connection between Husserl and Heidegger, Wittgenstein and John McDowell concerns the ab initio relational quality of intentionality, which denies that it is the quality or action of some thing called mind, striving to establish correspondences with the world. Just before discussing the way Being and Time works this out, Overgaard remarks: "To be a subject that thinks, believes, perceives … is not to be (or have) an inner world populated with special inner items to which one has some kind of unique, perhaps even infallible, access. Rather, to borrow a phrase from John McDowell, it is to be or have a peculiar 'openness to the layout of reality'" (WM, 41). Heidegger's contribution lies in his critique of subjectivity as what is "present-at-hand" -- absolute in the sense of non-relative to other things, material or immaterial; "a closed realm" without world. The later Husserl no doubt agreed with the necessity of a Lebenswelt, although Heidegger's critique no doubt extended to Husserl's intellectualism.

[4] Stanley Cavell already recognized this in Wittgenstein's writing; for a discussion of the suffering of another as a call or demand for a response from me, see Cavell, The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1979), 81, 429; noted by Overgaard, WM, 3, 142 and, in a related vein, 139.

[5] See Levinas, Totality and Infinity: Essay on Exteriority (Pittsburgh, Penna.: Duquesne University Press, 1969), 223, Overgaard's citation.

[6] Overgaard cites Levinas, Collected Philosophical Papers, tr. Alphonso Lingis (Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer, 1993), 124.

[7] Overgaard cites Wittgenstein, Last Writings on Philosophy of Psychology, vol. II, ed. G. H. von Wright and H. Nyman, tr. G. C. Luckhardt and M. A. E. Aue (Oxford: Blackwell, 1992), 92. Other posthumous Wittgenstein sources are also cited.

[8] Overgaard quotes Stanley Cavell's The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality and Tragedy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1979), 369.

[9] See Jocelyn Benoist, Les limites de l'intentionalité: Recherches phénoménologiques et analytiques (Paris: Vrin, 2005), 179, my translation.