Wittgenstein and the Limits of Language

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Hanne Appelqvist (ed.), Wittgenstein and the Limits of Language, Routledge, 2020, 298pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780815385011.

Reviewed by Duncan Richter, Virginia Military Institute


This is a collection of essays, most but not all exegetical, about the idea of limits of language in Wittgenstein's work, early and late. The papers are high in quality and varied in subject matter. I will say something about each of them, but start with some more general remarks about the book's topic.

In the foreword to the Tractatus, Wittgenstein says that a limit to thought cannot be drawn, because that would involve thinking both sides of the limit, including the unthinkable. Instead, therefore, he proposes to draw a limit to the expression of thoughts. We might well wonder exactly what this means, and whether it can be done without a parallel problem involving expressing the inexpressible. In his 1929 Lecture on Ethics, Wittgenstein compared the boundaries of language to the walls of a cage. Later, referring to this lecture in conversation with Friedrich Waismann, he said that language is not a cage.[1] Had he changed his mind? Or was he insisting that his metaphor not be taken too literally? (Perhaps a fly-bottle metaphor would be better.) Understanding what Wittgenstein's talk about the limits of language means could help us answer these questions, as well as helping us understand language itself better.

One danger in talking about the limits of language is that, in exploring what you take to be the edges of the intelligible, you will stray over the edge. Another is that you will be so careful that you will say little at all. Neither of these fates is inevitable, however, and neither would necessarily make your efforts worthless in any case. Work that moves from sense to nonsense could be instructive, if only as an illustration of a possible mistake. And work that says little or nothing might still be instructive, like the exercise of taking a machine apart and then putting it all back together again. The territory sketched in this collection, then, is perilous, but not so hazardous as to spell doom for all who enter it.

Hanne Appelqvist is especially interested in similarities between Wittgenstein's work and Kant's, some of which she outlines in her introduction to the book and in her joint contribution with Panu-Matti Pöykkö on "Wittgenstein and Levinas on the Transcendentality of Ethics". According to the Kantian reading of Wittgenstein, illogical thought is impossible, because logic is a formal condition of thought. Hence the interest in the limits of language, as Kant was interested in the limits of experience. This provides part of the rationale for the book, but not most of its subject matter.

In Part I which focuses on the early Wittgenstein, the first two essays, by A. W. Moore and Colin Johnston, are (roughly) of the taking-the-engine-apart kind. Moore begins with the idea that the Tractatus distinguishes between (i) thoughts, (ii) tautologies and contradictions, and (iii) nonsensical pseudo-propositions. He concludes with "the thought that, once the dust has settled, the familiar account" of this distinction "remains unambiguously intact" (p. 38). We end where we began, in other words. What has been gained? One might think that critics of this tripartite distinction, such as Cora Diamond and Michael Kremer (who argue that a 'proposition' can be pseudo in the sense that it is neither true nor false without being nonsense), have been shown to be wrong, but Moore is careful not to draw this conclusion. He likens his view to that of Silver Bronzo (see pp. 43-44), who is quite sympathetic with Diamond's and Kremer's reading of the Tractatus.[2] Rather than showing anyone to be wrong, Moore helps to clarify some of the issues relating to the three-part distinction he discusses, and what the textual evidence (which he regards as ambiguous) has to say about it.

Similarly, Johnston aims to clarify Wittgenstein's remarks on solipsism in the Tractatus. Thoughts about truth as something that can be grasped lead to what looks like idealism, the potential grasper having a unique role in the universe, but Johnston explains why this is not the case. Thought through, according to Wittgenstein and Johnston, solipsism coincides with pure realism. Any implied idealism is illusory. Like Moore, Johnston does not take us to an interesting destination, but the journey is enlightening.

The last essay in Part I has a more controversial thesis. Appelqvist and Pöykkö make substantial claims about the ethics of Wittgenstein and Levinas. Ethics is transcendental, according to the view they attribute to both Levinas and Wittgenstein. Like Kant, they see an important difference between the contingencies of facts of nature, on the one hand, and the absolute demands that ethics makes on human beings, on the other. This kind of demand is not grounded on something else, however. Rather, "The absolute ethical obligation . . . is the necessary condition for the possibility of the world's sense" (p. 85). Like logic, albeit in a different way, Appelqvist and Pöykkö argue credibly, ethics is necessary for meaning.

The second, longer part of the book focuses on Wittgenstein's later work. William Child defends both anti-reductionism about meaning and rule-following, and the view that Wittgenstein was such an anti-reductionist himself. This anti-reductionism holds that facts about meaning and rules are basic. No explanation can make someone understand how to understand an explanation. Rule-following and meaning cannot be explained in terms of some independent set of facts, although they do, Child argues, supervene on such facts. Two physically identical worlds will also be semantically and normatively identical, that is to say. We are back here to the kind of thesis that might seem uncontroversial, but Child points out that Wittgenstein has erroneously been read as a reductionist about meaning, or else as having nothing to say on the subject that isn't pleonastic.

In the next essay, Leila Haaparanta looks at what Carnap, Frege, and Wittgenstein say about philosophical assertions, arguing that all three regard philosophers' assertings as limited by norms. Because, for instance, the existence of the external world is certain rather than known, "it is not possible to make the assertion that the external world exists" (p. 129). This looks like an example of the danger for everyone working in this area of slipping into nonsense. That is, the allegedly impossible assertion seems to have been made after all, and in the very act of denying that this can be done. Not everything that looks like nonsense really is so, however, so neither Haaparanta's paper as a whole nor this part of it should be written off on this account, but there isn't room in this review for the careful sifting of evidence that would be needed to judge the matter.

While Haaparanta has a tight focus, Paul Standish takes a much broader approach, touching on what it means to be a philosopher, Wittgenstein's fondness for the word 'bloody', "resolute" readings of Wittgenstein, Cavell, Heidegger, and more. Like Haaparanta's, then, but for a different reason, his paper escapes the scope of this review.

The next two papers, by Yrsa Neuman and Constantine Sandis, get us back to sharply focused clarificatory work. Neuman looks at Moore's paradox -- involving the sentence "I believe it is raining and it is not raining" -- and shows that it is only apparently a paradox. That is, when a sentence like this is really a paradox it has no use, and when it has a use (reporting on a hallucination, say) it is not a paradox. So we do not here, after all, have an instance of a significant proposition that could not be said.

Sandis looks at Wittgenstein's use of the words 'we' and 'us', concluding that he is generally not making empirical claims about language-use by this or that (unspecified and potentially problematically limited) group but rather talking about norms in an unproblematic way. Wittgenstein's 'we', Sandis argues, on the basis of a lot of textual evidence, "is typically that of people who are as normal as possible in the relevant respect. This meaning is easily achieved without entering into spurious metaphysical debates regarding the ontology of we-groups" (p. 186).

The works of clarification in this collection all address real or potential misunderstandings, and try to show the way out of confusion. Hans-Johann Glock's paper on animal consciousness is brilliant at identifying confusions but pays less attention to how to get out of them. Glock defends a deflationist view of consciousness, insisting that consciousness is not as mysterious as Thomas Nagel and others take it to be. Rejecting the very idea of qualia as unintelligible on the basis of the private language argument, Glock proposes tackling what is left of the so-called hard problem of consciousness with a "divide-and-conquer strategy" (p. 206). This involves looking at questions such as "What is it like for a G [e.g., a woman] to be a G?" and "What is it like for A [e.g., Sonja] to be A?" It is hard to know what to make of such questions, Glock observes, but he suggests some strategies for making them intelligible. The first is to ask "How is it for a woman to be a woman?" instead of "What is it like for a woman to be a woman?" This, Glock claims is less confusing (which is debatable). He goes on to note that "to ask what it is for a woman to be a woman may boil down to asking what it is like to be a woman, and hence to asking what kinds of lives women lead" (p. 207). This is quite true, but the word 'may' seems important. The meaning of a question appears to depend on its use, which could vary from one circumstance to another and from one questioner to another. Which is why it seems important not to try to work out the meaning in isolation but to look at it in the context of its use. This would involve looking at particular cases, and seeing there what was meant, or how someone had come to mean nothing at all. Glock is excellent at pointing out fishy-smelling philosophers' pronouncements. But his method of attack offers little by way of a cure beyond a recommendation to believe x instead of y. In addition, by treating language independently of those who use it, his method at least runs the risk of missing its targets.

This way of talking about language as if it existed independently, like the walls of a cage, comes out also when Glock talks about a limitation imposed by our language, which might seem to invite the question why we don't change this limitation. He is responding to Donald Davidson's observation that we do not know how to make sense of questions such as whether a dog knows that the president of the bank is home. Asking whether this inability of ours is because of something about dogs or something about our language, Glock answers that it is "a limitation imposed by our language on creatures without language" (p. 219). This makes it sound as if there is something we cannot do because of the nature of our language. But is it really that we cannot ask certain questions about, or apply certain concepts to, non-human animals, or that we simply do not do so? If we cannot do it then the question why we cannot seems very puzzling. Here the very idea of limits of language becomes problematic.

Particularly helpful for better understanding the idea is Sami Pihlström's paper, which focuses on the role of the idea of limits of language in Wittgenstein's, and Wittgenstein-inspired, philosophy of religion. Pihlström explains the important difference between the idea that the realm of religion and ethics is transcendent, lying beyond the world of nature and science, and the idea that religion and ethics are transcendental, providing the framework through which we see and understand the world. The ideas are quite different, and Wittgenstein, who at least early on closely connects ethics with religion, says in Tractatus 6.421 that ethics is transcendental. This certainly suggests a Kantian element in Wittgenstein's thinking, as Pihlström argues.

On the other hand, the transcendental-not-transcendent reading encounters some problems, which Pihlström does not try to hide. It is, he says, "somewhat unfortunate" (p. 226) that Wittgenstein uses the word 'ausserhalb' (outside or beyond) in the Tractatus, and the word 'supernatural' in the Lecture on Ethics. Indeed, Pihlström presents plenty of evidence from the Tractatus and the Lecture on Ethics that supports the view, which he goes on to reject, that the early Wittgenstein thought of the ethical and the religious as transcendent (see p. 225). One can, like Pihlström, reject this evidence as misleading, or instead reject Wittgenstein's use of the word 'transcendental' as misleading, or try to find some way of making sense of a transcendent-and-transcendental view. For instance, one could (try to) read the early Wittgenstein as regarding ethics as both utterly unlike science, hence not in the fact-stating business, hence, in a sense, going beyond the natural world (i.e., as transcendent), and as not a particular realm or subject within the world but something more pervasive and a priori (transcendental).

The later Wittgenstein, Pihlström notes, talks more about pictures that we use than about limits of language (although he does sometimes talk about such limits, as Child notes on p. 94), and suggests that religion involves the use of pictures that make a particular world, or a way of seeing the world, possible. Such pictures can therefore be thought of as transcendental. Whether they should be thought of this way might depend in part on how useful doing so is. One thing that Pihlström does with it is to address the question of what to say about the problem of evil. Against both the atheist and the would-be provider of a theodicy, Pihlström argues, one could object that morally evaluating God's motives is "beyond the meanings available in religious language-games" (p. 238). There is something to this, but it is not a completely simple matter. What, for instance, are we to make of Genesis 18:20-33, in which Abraham seems to persuade God to spare the city of Sodom if there are ten righteous people there? It is not self-evident that Abraham is not morally evaluating God's proposed action, nor that he is talking nonsense. As with some of what concerns Glock, it appears to make a difference who the speaker is and what the context is, so that it is a mistake to say simply that the rules of language, like the bars of a cage, allow these sentences but not those.

The next essay provides a very good example of the value of paying careful attention to context and use in explaining Wittgenstein's response to what Augustine says about music, memory, and time. Here, Eran Guter takes us through Augustine's thought that "the paradox of musical motion can be resolved only by introducing a notion of musical time that is based on the framework of memory time" (p. 248), explaining how Augustine comes to this view and how Wittgenstein, in his middle period, undoes it. This undoing involves identifying the pictures (of time as a substance, of 'now' as the name of an instant) that hold Augustine and others captive, and attending to ordinary uses of relevant words.

Along the way, Guter quotes the Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics vii 18, where Wittgenstein writes: "could we talk about minutes and hours . . . if there were no clocks . . . ? In that case -- we should say -- the measure of time would have lost its meaning" (p. 262). It is not, Wittgenstein's suggestion seems to be, that such things as clocks make our time-talk possible, even though without them it would not have the meaning that it does. We might compare this with Zettel §351:

"If humans were not in general agreed about the colours of things, if undetermined cases were not exceptional, then our concept of colour could not exist." No: our concept would not exist.

Certain facts of nature are indeed bound up with our language, Wittgenstein appears to think, but he apparently rejects the idea that they should be thought of as making it possible, perhaps because this suggests too foundational, or simple, a picture. Pihlström captures some of the complexity nicely when, paraphrasing Lars Hertzberg, he recommends we understand Wittgenstein "as suggesting that our ways of speaking and living are inevitably connected with the ways the world around us factually is, though of course those ways are available to us . . . only from the point of view of the language-games we play" (pp. 230-231).

The book ends with Danièle Moyal-Sharrock's essay on how literature can show what cannot be said. This, as she is well aware, is a difficult subject to talk about. Indeed she calls her own explanation poor (see p. 278), and this is not only modesty (although it might be partly that) but a recognition that a measure of failure comes with the territory when one writes about the ineffable. Her goal is to indicate the moral importance of literature which, she says, enhances "our understanding of what it means to be prey to ambition, remorse, alienation, jealousy, gnawing envy, and so on" (p. 280). The examples she uses, from Flaubert, Shakespeare, and Dostoevsky, are certainly persuasive. It is not obvious that non-fiction, even in the form of a newspaper report, cannot have the same effect as literature in this regard, but this counts little against Moyal-Sharrock's larger, positive, point about what literature can do.

In sum, this is a varied and illuminating collection. It comes at an important idea from a number of angles, and helps show the value of the Kantian reading that inspires it.

[1] Brian McGuiness (ed.), Ludwig Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, Blackwell, 1979, p. 117.

[2] Silver Bronzo "Wittgenstein, Theories of Meaning, and Linguistic Disjunctivism," European Journal of Philosophy, Dec. 2017, Vol. 25, Issue 4, pp. 1340-1364.