Wittgenstein in Cambridge: Letters and Documents 1911-1951

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Brian McGuinness (ed.), Wittgenstein in Cambridge: Letters and Documents 1911-1951, Blackwell, 2008, 498pp., $134.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405147019.

Reviewed by Andrew Hsu, UCLA


This volume assembles four hundred and thirty-nine letters and documents pertaining to Ludwig Wittgenstein's intellectual and academic life in Cambridge. The bulk consists of correspondence with colleagues, students and friends associated with Cambridge University. It contains nearly all of the two hundred and five letters to and from Bertrand Russell, Frank Ramsey, John Maynard Keynes, G. E. Moore and Piero Sraffa previously published in Ludwig Wittgenstein: Cambridge Letters[1] which the present volume succeeds. Thirty-nine notes and letters by Wittgenstein and Sraffa augment the new collection. (The old one contained only a single letter from Sraffa.) Much of the added material comes from after the mid 1930s and most of that is correspondence with associates of Wittgenstein's later years such as Norman Malcolm, G. H. von Wright, Rush Rhees, Yorick Smythies and John Wisdom. The new volume also documents Wittgenstein's life in the university with notes about academic appointments, arrangements for lectures and so forth. The collection includes the minutes of some meetings of the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club at which Wittgenstein spoke. Brian McGuinness provides a substantial biographical introduction, translations of passages in German (alongside their originals) and extensive notes identifying people, places and events mentioned in the documents.

The letters naturally register major events in Wittgenstein's life in the years 1911-1951. They mention military service during the First World War, the Nazi Anschluss in Austria, applying for British citizenship, trips to Austria, Norway, the Soviet Union, the United States and Ireland, etc. But the collection does not and is not intended to touch on all aspects of Wittgenstein's life or even his life in the university. The editor omits "more private and intimate correspondence with Cambridge friends." It should also be noted that the correspondence published here is not Wittgenstein's wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel.[2] The collection does not include correspondence pertaining directly to Wittgenstein's philosophical work such as the notes he wrote for C. K. Ogden about translating the Tractatus. Documents such as the notes published in the appendices to Notebooks 1914-1916, Moore's accounts of Wittgenstein's 1930-1933 lectures and various other lecture notes, not to mention memoirs and recollections of Wittgenstein at Cambridge, are, of course, also excluded.[3]

For the most part, the letters collected here do not discuss or even mention the subjects of Wittgenstein's lectures or the material he works up in contemporaneous manuscripts. There are some exceptions. First, there are more than a dozen letters between Wittgenstein and Russell on philosophical logic written between 1912 and 1920, the period of Wittgenstein's first stay in Cambridge and the years leading up to the publication of the Tractatus. Second, there is a morsel on deduction in a 1914 letter to Moore. Third, there are a couple of 1927 letters in which Wittgenstein and Ramsey trade comments on Ramsey's Foundations of Mathematics. Fourth, there is one letter from Wittgenstein to Moore about Moore's Paradox from 1944. (The editor includes Elizabeth Anscombe's brief minutes of a 1945 meeting of the Moral Sciences Club at which Wittgenstein speaks about the paradox.) With the exception of the minutes, all of the aforementioned material appeared in the earlier collection of Cambridge letters or has been printed or excerpted elsewhere.

The fifth exceptions occur in the newly published exchanges between Wittgenstein and Sraffa. From 1932, there is a list of points and questions on language, sense and nonsense that Sraffa prepared for discussion with Wittgenstein. From 1934, there are four notes and letters about understanding and explaining human action in general and current events in particular. In the 1934 documents, Wittgenstein claims it is fallacious to explain changes in fashion by changes in taste, as if "every action which people do is preceded by a particular state of mind of which the action is the outcome" or as if there had to be "a mental reservoir in which the real causes of our actions are kept." Rather, change of taste consists in, among other things, tailors designing what they design. So it is a mistake to say -- as Wittgenstein himself was initially inclined to do -- that "Germans cannot live contentedly in … a republic because they are a monarchist people" or that Germany's "physiognomy" explains why Germany cannot become a proper republic. Sraffa agrees, but then presses the idea of a reservoir of "definite concrete things, preferably measurable or ascertainable with some certainty" from which we may ascertain "things of the sort of the quantity of coal produced in Germany … not the spirit of the German people". Sraffa closes with the observation that he and Wittgenstein differ over the role of "science" and "intuition" in understanding human action. Alas, there is no record of whether or how they discussed this issue.

As McGuinness points out, the ideas Wittgenstein broaches in this dialog with Sraffa find their way into the Blue and Brown Books. Unfortunately, there do not appear to be notes or letters about other talks with Sraffa to which Wittgenstein alludes in the Nachlass.[4] Although the evidence remains fragmentary, the newly published documents do give some sense of why Wittgenstein acknowledges Sraffa's stimulus and influence in the Preface to Philosophical Investigations and elsewhere.

Aside from the exchanges with Sraffa and the letter on Moore's Paradox, most of the letters printed here concern personal matters ranging from the trivial ("I left a couple of shirts at your house when I was at Oxford"[5]) to the profound ("The thing now is to live in the world in which you are, not to think or dream about the world you would like to be in. Look at people's sufferings, physical and mental, you have them close at hand, and this ought to be a good remedy for your troubles"[6]). Quite a few of the letters are philosophically interesting even though they do not explicitly discuss the themes of Wittgenstein's lectures and notebooks. They shed direct light on Wittgenstein views on ethical, cultural, spiritual and religious matters. They may also throw indirect light on the interests and aspirations that animate Wittgenstein's more formal philosophical work. This was, after all, the philosopher who wrote of the Tractatus, "My work consists of two parts: the one presented here plus all that I have not written. And it is precisely this second part that is the important one."[7] The voice one hears throughout the notes and correspondence is a familiar one; its tone is continuous with that in Wittgenstein's other writings. A few of the letters display his distinctive, spare form of eloquence. A few show a less familiar, whimsical side to their author. Letters to Norman Malcolm joke about "soupy" Christmas cards and attest to Wittgenstein's previously reported fondness for American detective stories. Letters to the physicist W. H. Watson reveal that Wittgenstein kept a Collection of Nonsense containing items gleaned from books, magazines and newspapers, some cut by Wittgenstein himself, others contributed by friends. Articles about worthies opining about the relationship of science and religion are prized specimens.

This volume may disappoint readers hoping for explicit discussions of Wittgenstein's philosophical ideas. It is primarily a historical and biographical resource.[8] The editor's stated aim is to picture a portion of Wittgenstein's "pattern of … life and work" centered on Cambridge. In that he has largely succeeded. Readers who are interested in how the pattern portrayed in McGuinness' selection fits with Wittgenstein's philosophical writing and lecturing will, however, wish to consult von Wright's description of the Nachlass and James Klagge's chronological list of Wittgenstein's lectures and discussions alongside the material in the present volume.[9]

[1] Ludwig Wittgenstein: Cambridge Letters, edited by Brian McGuinness and G. H. von Wright (Blackwell Publishing, 1995).

[2] All of Wittgenstein's correspondence is now being gathered in Ludwig Wittgenstein: Gesamtbriefwechsel/Complete Correspondence in the InteLex Past Masters electronic series. See http://www.nlx.com/titles/titllwgb.htm (accessed 1 October 2008).

[3] See the four volume Portraits of Wittgenstein, edited by F. A. Flowers III (Thoemmes Press, 1999) for a collection of such documents.

[4] See Wittgenstein's Nachlass: the Bergen Electronic Edition (Oxford University Press, 1998-2000), Ms. 113, p. 25r, Ts. 211, p. 572, Ts. 212, p. 709, Ts. 213, p. 242 , Ts. 213, p. 242r and Ts. 212, p. 1108 all dating from 1932-1933 and Ms. 117, p. 172 and Ms. 157b, p. 5v dating from 1937-1938.

[5] Item 369: Letter to Y. Smythies 27.7.1947.

[6] Item 214: Letter to M. O'C. Drury [February 1938].

[7] "Letters to Ludwig von Ficker", edited by Allen Janik and translated by B. Gillette in Wittgenstein: Sources and Perspectives edited by C. G. Luckhardt (Harvester Press, 1979).

[8] Several of the papers collected in Wittgenstein: Biography and Philosophy, edited by James C. Klagge (Cambridge University Press, 2001) make suggestions about how Wittgenstein's biography and philosophy might be read together.

[9] G. H. von Wright, "The Wittgenstein Papers" in Wittgenstein (University of Minnesota Press, 1982). James C. Klagge, "Wittgenstein's Lectures" in Ludwig Wittgenstein: Private and Public Occasions, edited by James C. Klagge and Alfred Nordmann (Rowman and Littlefield, 2003).