Wittgenstein's Apprenticeship with Russell

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Gregory Landini, Wittgenstein's Apprenticeship with Russell, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 300pp., $96.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521870238.

Reviewed by Nicholas Griffin, McMaster University


The prevailing consensus about the early Wittgenstein is that, around 1913, having learnt everything Russell had to teach him, he turned his back on Russell's philosophy -- on Russell's problems, as well as his solutions to them -- and set off in his own direction to land up, eventually, with the Tractatus.  Where he landed up, we are not quite sure -- for there is absolutely no consensus about how the Tractatus should be understood -- but most commentators do agree that it was a place far from Russell; a position so remote from Russell that Russell's own work was essentially irrelevant to it and that Russell himself failed utterly to understand it.  This view is forcefully controverted in almost every detail by Landini's new book.

It is certainly well over-due for reassessment.  Since the opening of the Russell Archives in 1968 a mass of new Russell material has become available which has led to very radical changes in our understanding of his philosophy.  Since Russell's actual position was very different from what was formerly supposed, we are hardly entitled, without a new investigation, to continue to believe that it was so remote from Wittgenstein's.  Landini himself, in previous work,[1] has made really fundamental contributions to the repositioning of Russell by urging the importance of Russell's substitutional theory.  The substitutional theory, which was completely unknown until the first published manuscripts began to emerge from the Archives in 1973,[2] was Russell's heroic attempt to solve the paradoxes using a single style of variable ranging indifferently over terms and propositions.  The theory failed because propositional paradoxes emerged within it.  Russell's response was to eliminate propositions by means of his multiple relation theory of judgment and to introduce the ramified theory of types.  For a long time many of us believed that that was the end of the unrestricted variable -- which some of us had come to love.  Landini, however, maintained that the unrestricted variable lived on in the type theory of Principia; that there was only one type of entity in Principia and that the ramified hierarchy of types and orders had a nominalist semantics, as against the standard view, which owed much to Quine, according to which it had a realist semantics with different styles of variable ranging over different styles of entities.

The realist interpretation of the theory of types in Principia is one of two dogmas of Russellian interpretation that Landini introduces early in his book (p. 5) and to which he ascribes the prevailing errors in the interpretation of Wittgenstein's relation to Russell.  The other is the view that Russell's logical atomism is a form of reductive empiricism.  Landini distinguishes between elimination and reductive identity as two forms of ontological reduction, illustrating the distinction from the history of science (pp. 14-15).  In the former, an item (e.g. caloric or the aether) is entirely removed from the ontology of science; in the latter (Landini does not give an explicit example, but I suppose the usual one of light as a form of electromagnetic radiation will do), an ontological commitment is preserved, but to a different sort of item, that to which the targeted item is reduced.  Relativity theory did not reduce the aether to space-time, but got rid of it altogether.  Maxwell's electromagnetic theory did not get rid of light, but identified it with something that had previously been thought to be distinct.  Landini's view is that the ontological reductions for which Russell is famous (numbers, classes, physical objects, minds) are all eliminations.  When Russell says that tables and chairs are logical fictions he is to be understood entirely literally: it is not that one ontological commitment is to be replaced by another, it is that an ontological commitment is to be eliminated.  The two dogmas are linked in Landini's account, because on the basis of the unrestricted variable Russell was able to construct in the substitutional theory a system which 'emulates a type-theory of attributes in intension (and classes in the logical sense) without its ontology' (p. 20).  In other words, Russell used the unrestricted variable to effect an eliminative reduction: the variable ranged over the individuals which comprised the theory's ontology, everything else was a logical construction without ontological import.  In Principia, on Landini's account, Russell did not abandon this project, but extended it to include propositions as well (p. 22).

How does all this relate to Wittgenstein?  In the first place, it is an indisputable fact that Wittgenstein's first serious break from one of Russell's major positions came in 1913 with his rejection of the multiple relation theory.  This Landini (pp. 65ff) explains as the result of Wittgenstein's realizing that, since there was only one style of variable in Principia, type distinctions could not be used to restrict the argument positions of the belief relation to prevent the judging of nonsense.  Formerly, embracing realist semantics for type theory, I held that the different argument positions did carry different type restrictions, but that Wittgenstein had pointed out that every elementary judgment would presuppose prior higher-order judgments assigning objects to their appropriate type.  Since the point of the theory in Principia was to build higher-order judgments up from elementary ones, the process was viciously circular.  I now think that this was misplaced ingenuity, forced on me by the assumption that Russell intended a realist interpretation of type theory.  Landini's explanation is simpler; in fact, so simple that one is surprised Russell had not spotted the problem himself.  Perhaps its relative obviousness, once it is pointed out, accounts for Russell's anguish at the discovery.

Secondly, and more generally, Landini (ch. 3) identifies Wittgenstein's claim that his fundamental idea in the Tractatus was that 'the "logical constants" are not representatives' (TLP, 4.03) with what Wittgenstein told Russell (letter, 19 August 1919) was his 'main contention', namely the doctrine of showing.  Landini does this by construing 'logical constants' widely to include all expressions with logical or semantic content, including what Wittgenstein called 'formal concepts' (TLP, 4.1272).  All such could only be shown by means of grammar; to admit them as representatives, i.e. to try to 'say' them, would be to accord ontological status to what they represented.  The task was to specify a grammar by which they could be shown.  The evident inspiration for such a project was Russell's construction of the order/type hierarchy of Principia in which ontological import was confined to the values of the variables, and everything else was proxied by constructions.  Where Wittgenstein differed from Russell was in how far he wanted to take this.  More things had to be eliminated than Russell had yet contemplated.  This seems to me a considerably more plausible reading of the Tractatus than most of those hitherto proposed.

Landini's two central chapters (4 and 5) are concerned with how well Wittgenstein carried out the project: the results are not very encouraging.  The Tractatus is strewn with claims for which no support is offered, as if proof were something with which great minds should not be taxed.  Subsequent generations have laboured long, hard, and ingeniously to fill in the gaps, attributing, with selfless generosity, their best efforts to the genius of the master.  Landini himself goes to extraordinary lengths to develop Wittgenstein's project, providing, for example, a formal logic of exclusive quantifiers (Appendix A), long needed to cope with Wittgenstein's elimination of identity.  No one hitherto has gone to quite such lengths on Wittgenstein's behalf, although Ramsey and Hintikka (in a little known early paper)[3] provided translation rules between exclusive and inclusive quantifiers.  Moreover, Landini (pp. 264-65) is able to demonstrate how the use of exclusive quantifiers shows the truth of what Russell tried to say in the axiom of infinity (as required by TLP 5.535).  So far as I can see, the exclusive quantifiers are entirely successful.  The same cannot be said of attempts to shore up Wittgenstein's treatment of logic by means of the N-operator or his treatment of arithmetic by means of the Σ-operator.  Both were intended to show, via a practice of calculation (on formulae and numerals, respectively), what was previously said in formal, axiomatized systems of logic and arithmetic, thereby eliminating any appearance of ontologies of logical constants or numbers and of any truths about them.  Landini offers a very extended discussion of each (in chs. 3 and 4, respectively) but, despite appeal to every available patch and prop, both fail -- as Russell noted in his Introduction.  Given what Russell said about the advantages of theft over honest toil in the case of Dedekind cuts, it is surprising that he didn't comment here on the advantages of forgery!  As Landini says of the N-operator: it 'postulates the existence of a construction to fit a research paradigm, and presents itself as reaching that goal.  But it is little more than bravado based on the belief that logic must be decidable' (p. 146).

Rather surprisingly, Landini maintains that Wittgenstein's Tractarian treatment of arithmetic is a form of logicism.  It is not, evidently, the form of logicism that is usually recognized, that in which arithmetic theorems are derived from logical principles, and arithmetic concepts defined in terms of logical concepts.  Landini's claim is based rather on the analogy between N and Σ.  But it is only an analogy, and not a perfect one: Σ starts from '0' and recursively generates a series of numerals; N has no such effect.  Nor is it the case that the Σ-operator is a generalization of N; and if it were, it would suggest rather the arithmetization of logic than the logicization of arithmetic.  It is rather that both are intended to be part of the scaffolding shared by logic and arithmetic; though to count the result as logicism would, I think, require showing that there really was a single scaffolding and not two distinct but analogous ones.

Landini devotes Chapter 6 to Russell's own attempts to explore Wittgenstein's Tractarian programme, notably in the second edition of Principia.  Unlike Wittgenstein, Russell was not content to gesture towards solutions with elegant declarations, but actually undertook the necessary constructive work, even though many commentators suppose him to have given up serious work in logic by this time.  But despite these efforts and Russell's vastly greater technical skill, the results are still not encouraging: large parts of arithmetic are lost without the Axiom of Reducibility.  But not, Landini argues, mathematical induction.  Gödel long ago found a flaw in Russell's proof and wondered if it could be fixed; Myhill much later argued that it couldn't.[4]  Landini, on the basis of (another) reinterpretation of Principia (this time of the second edition), argues that it can.  Even so, the results of Wittgenstein's project for arithmetic are serious: the real numbers are lost, only the natural numbers can be defined.  One thing that Landini emphasizes, and that Russell in his Introduction to the second edition makes clear, is that Russell, contrary to widespread opinion, was not actually embracing Wittgenstein's views in the second edition: he was exploring them, by deriving their consequences.  Russell concludes his analysis, not by rejecting real analysis, but by hoping that some replacement for the Axiom of Reducibility might salvage it (PM2, vol. 1, p. xlv).

In other respects as well, Wittgenstein does not come out well from Landini's account.  Wittgenstein, for example, is quite widely credited with having invented truth-tables.  This was hardly a world-shaking achievement -- once truth-conditions for the truth-functors were fully stated (as Russell stated those for material implication in Principles of Mathematics, p. 15) it was pretty obvious that this information could be presented in tabular form -- but Landini shows (pp. 119-20) that it wasn't Wittgenstein's: truth-tables were used to verify theorems in Müller's Abriss of Schröder's Logik (1909, p. 708).  Given the amount that has been written on this topic, it is astonishing that this could have been missed: the truth-tables are immediately apparent to anyone who opens the book at the right page.

Not everything in Landini's book is so convincing.  For example, in 1913 David Pinsent recorded that Wittgenstein might be called upon to 'rewrite' the first eleven chapters of Principia -- 'a splendid triumph for him', he said admiringly.  To my knowledge, no one has ever considered just what Wittgenstein was expected to do with the first eleven chapters of Principia.  But Landini (pp. 9-10) suggests that, in the light of Sheffer's discovery (published earlier that year) that all the truth-functions could be defined in terms of a single connective, Russell had proposed that Wittgenstein find a single axiom formulation of the sentential logic of Principia.  This was not an implausible assignment for a bright student, but, if it was Wittgenstein's, he evidently flunked it, for the solution was discovered by Nicod in 1916.  But there are reasons for doubting whether this was the project.  In the first place, it doesn't match Pinsent's explicit reference to the first eleven chapters of Principia: sentential logic takes up just the first five, the first eleven cover quantification theory as well, up to and including descriptions.  Secondly, whatever illusions Russell may have had about Wittgenstein's abilities as a philosopher, there is no suggestion that he had any about his competence as a pure logician.  As Landini amply demonstrates, the technical material in the Tractatus is markedly deficient, as Russell acknowledged (with the mildest of reproofs) in his Introduction.  He would surely have known in 1913 that a single-axiom reformulation would likely have been beyond the powers of his favourite student.  More importantly, Pinsent's comment is made just a couple of months after Wittgenstein's devastating attack on Russell's multiple relation theory of judgment, on which the theory of orders in Principia was based.  Reformulating Principia so as to obviate its dependence on the multiple relation theory would certainly have seemed a more important project to Russell, and one more directly related to Wittgenstein's interests and abilities, than an axiom-shuffling reformulation of sentential logic.  On the other hand, if Russell and Wittgenstein thought that this would be a routine task -- and Pinsent gives no hint that Wittgenstein spurned the task, he suggests rather that Wittgenstein himself thought it would be a 'splendid triumph' -- then neither of them realized at that time how difficult a problem it would be.[5]

Landini's book is a strongly revisionary account of the relation between Wittgenstein's philosophy and Russell's.  It emphasizes how Wittgenstein's project in the Tractatus was derived from Russell's and just how many serious gaps there were in its prosecution.  The book is thus likely to infuriate the many philosophers who believe that Wittgenstein's every remark in the Tractatus was backed by the deepest insight (if only we could discover what it was).  Such philosophers will need to mount a serious reply to Landini's very detailed arguments.  They will have their work cut out for them.

[1] See especially Russell's Hidden Substitutional Theory, (Oxford University Press, 1998) and a long series of papers.

[2] The first material to be published was 'On the Substitutional Theory of Classes and Relations' in Russell, Essays in Analysis, edited by Douglas Lackey, (London: Allen and Unwin, 1973).

[3] Frank P. Ramsey, 'Identity', in Notes on Philosophy, Probability and Mathematics, edited by Maria Carla Galavotti (Naples: Bibliopolis, 1991), pp. 155-69; and Jaakko Hintikka, 'Identity, Variables, and Impredicative Definitions', Journal of Symbolic Logic, 21 (1956), pp. 225-45.

[4] Kurt Gödel, 'Russell's Mathematical Logic', in P.A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, (La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 1989; 1st edn. 1944); Myhill, 'The Indefinability of the Set of Natural Numbers in the Ramified Principia', in G. Nakhnikian (ed.), Bertrand Russell's Philosophy, (London: Duckworth, 1974).

[5] If rewriting the first 100 pages of a 2000 page book was regarded as a 'splendid triumph' by the inner Wittgenstein circle in 1913, it is worth considering what sort of a triumph they thought writing the book itself had been.