Wittgenstein's Copernican Revolution: The Question of Linguistic Idealism

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Dilman, Ilham, Wittgenstein's Copernican Revolution: The Question of Linguistic Idealism, Palgrave, 2002, x + 226pp, $62.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-333-97354-2.

Reviewed by Eric Loomis, University of South Alabama


The Kantian overtones in the title of this latest book by Ilham Dilman are, of course, intentional. Wittgenstein’s Copernican Revolution, in Dilman’s view, is the position that “our language is not founded on an empirical reality with which we are in contact through sense perception. Rather our language determines the kind of contact we have with such a reality and our conception of it” (p. 76). Like Kant, Wittgenstein is not trying to defend a position within the traditional realist/idealist debate but rather trying to undermine certain presuppositions of it.

In Kant’s case, the presupposition to be undermined is, very roughly, the notion that either our concepts are products of an independent and empirically discovered reality or our concepts are wholly mental fabrications. Kant’s “revolution” rejects this dilemma as false and instead argues that while the form of our empirical knowledge and experience is indeed a contribution of the mind, the intuited “content” of that knowledge is both necessary for it and a product of factors other than the mind. In Wittgenstein’s case, the presupposition to be rejected is that the distinction between what is real and what is not is itself independent of language. Rather, this distinction appears only within a “dimension of reality” that is provided by language. Language is thus for Wittgenstein a precondition of the distinction between real and unreal, and this in a way akin to the way in which pure a priori concepts and categories are a precondition of experience for Kant. Realism and idealism alike ignore this precondition, and so fall into error.

Dilman’s thesis is thus that Wittgenstein is neither a realist nor an idealist, but is rather concerned with dismantling assumptions about the relation of language and reality that motivate the realist/idealist debate. Dilman directs his criticism principally against realism since, he thinks, idealism is a “satellite” of realism that is motivated largely by realism’s failures (18). Somewhat revealingly, however, it is idealism with which Dilman wrestles most throughout the book, returning to it again and again in an attempt – unsuccessful, I will argue – to distinguish Wittgenstein’s position from idealism.

Wittgenstein’s Copernican Revolution develops these ideas through a discussion of other Wittgenstein interpreters, including Bernard Williams, G. E. M. Anscombe, Cora Diamond, and Hilary Putnam. The book is at its best when Dilman focuses on realism and brings Wittgenstein’s arguments to bear against it. The author characterizes several forms of realism, such as realism about physical facts, other minds, and kind-terms, and sees behind each the “fundamental assumption of a physical world [that is] independent of us” and which serves as the ultimate basis of our knowledge (18). Each of the arguments against realism involves the claim that realists have no non-question-begging way of securing the existence of such a world.

The primary move in this attack involves arguing that the intelligibility of the distinction between what we call “real” and “unreal” involves criteria that presuppose a language—”language” here understood in a broad sense that includes not only a descriptive apparatus but also a “grammar” that provides norms of identification, justification, verification, and so forth. Thus,

The distinction between what is real and what is not, as it comes into different areas of our talk and thought, as it appears in our questions, belongs to our language and varies with what it captures or embraces in its different grammars: its universe of discourse. The dimension of reality in which we speak of something as real – for example the colour of a piece of material – is thus internal to the grammar of a mode of discourse – colour-language (42).

In other words, there must be conditions under which we call a color-judgment correct or well-founded, or under which we call two colors the same, or under which we call an apparent color “merely apparent”, and these conditions are preconditions of the intelligibility of the claim that something is a particular color. The concepts real and unreal, Dilman argues (40ff.), have application only against this background of grammatical preconditions. These are preconditions of meaning and sense, so when realism attempts to describe, or at least indicate or somehow point to, a world independent of these conditions, it implicitly presupposes them and so begs the question in its favor.

Dilman develops this general argument in further detail in two ways. The first works to defend the claim that “induction is an integral part of a whole way of living and derives its intelligibility from its connection with much else that is part of that way of living” (78). Induction on this conception is a tool of language, one that partially sets up the activity of description and prediction. Attempts to treat general inductive statements as themselves descriptions, and then to justify these descriptions in terms of general facts about the language-independent world, lead to Humean circularity problems; a point Dilman illustrates in several ways, one of which involves a well-executed imaginary dialogue between Hume and Wittgenstein.

The second detailed case against realism involves kind terms and classification. Here the key move appears to be that the identification of sameness and difference requires the sorting of things into kinds, and that this in turn presupposes human language and its uses. Much of the argument here proceeds by cases, with Dilman following Wittgenstein in noting similarities, such as that between mental or physical strain, or between deep sorrow and a deep well, which only appear to exist in language (70-1). Another part of the argument is more general, with Dilman claiming “where we have objects to classify we have already names for them, and so a whole range of similarities and differences from which we can select in classifying them in different ways,” that is:

If we are to explain what we mean by, say, ‘elm tree’, we shall point to similarities and differences between trees we call by that name and others we call by other names. But then we would have to go on to explain what makes a plant a tree as opposed to, say, a shrub, and so on. And what we shall come down to in the end will not be as it were, bare particulars which we call by the same name because of the way they resemble each other, but the grammar in which we carry out the comparisons in question. So what we come down to in the end are not, and indeed cannot be, similarities and differences exhibited by nature (69).

The argument here is difficult to see through to the intended conclusion. For even if we grant that an explanation of why we say two things are of a kind will always involve a further appeal to kinds, this doesn’t by itself show that we aren’t, in the end, coming down to similarities and differences exhibited by nature, but only that an explanation of kind-terms always presupposes other kind-terms.

These more detailed criticisms of realism are interesting, although they are not particularly new; Dilman himself has presented both arguments elsewhere, as have others such as Sören Stenlund in his Language and Philosophical Problems. And it should be emphasized that they are not the only anti-realist arguments that Wittgenstein had under his belt. In particular, Wittgenstein’s notes of the early 1930s, many of which have been published as the Philosophical Remarks and the Philosophical Grammar, contain numerous and extended discussions of the relation of language to reality. I mention these in part because Dilman does not – he never refers to either of these texts – and it’s a strange omission, for there are many arguments here that would bolster Dilman’s case against realism (see especially Wittgenstein’s extended discussions in the Philosophical Grammar of the role of samples and of the impossibility of justifying a rule of grammar by the fact which it allegedly describes in Part I, chapter IV, and of the alleged “arbitrariness” of grammar in chapters VII – X).

Throughout his discussions of realism, Dilman is concerned to show us that Wittgenstein’s arguments do not lead to a “linguistic idealism.” Here too he wishes to draw a link between Wittgenstein and Kant, in that both make a distinction between form (grammatical form for Wittgenstein, a priori concepts and intuitions for Kant) and content that allows them to simultaneously maintain that subjects make a contribution to experience without producing that experience (cf. 32f, 158). But here Dilman’s linkage of Wittgenstein and Kant starts leading to difficulties, for although he repeatedly insists that Wittgenstein rejected any form of idealism, it’s hard to see how Dilman avoids the conclusion that he is one.

Dilman does argue against attributing one form of idealism to Wittgenstein by pointing out how language, and its grammatical rules and logical forms, emerges only within a context of factors that are independent of it, such as historical, environmental and biological factors (cf. 110f.). Since Wittgenstein was sensitive to these formative factors, the view that the existence of the world is somehow dependent upon the language used to describe it, a view Dilman calls “linguistic idealism”, cannot be attributed to him, for he did not accept the arbitrariness of language that, Dilman thinks, such a view requires.

Now Dilman is correct that Wittgenstein did not regard language as a wholly arbitrary construction. But is this alone a sufficient reason to deny the claim that Wittgenstein is an idealist? If it is, idealism has to be committed to the view that subjects (or language and language users) are not only necessary but also sufficient for a world. Idealism, in other words, has to involve something like the claim that:

There is a world if and only if there are subjects.

I’ll call a position that accepts this biconditional “absolute idealism.” Dilman appears to identify idealism with absolute idealism. He does so by connecting idealism to the position that there is a radical arbitrariness to the way the world actually is (cf. 38, 113, 136). Now the world is radically arbitrary only if there are no factors other than subjects (understood broadly to include the makers and users of language) that determine that the world is or is a certain way, and this implies that subjects are sufficient for the world, as absolute idealism asserts.

The problem here is that most idealists are not absolute idealists. Berkeley, for example, was not an absolute idealist. He espoused a much weaker claim, which I’ll call “qualified idealism”:

There is a world only if there are subjects.

Berkeley never claimed that we make or produce the world (Berkeley’s God is a special case, although I think this may be true even for Him). Berkeley thought that we are a condition for the world, in the sense that if there are no perceivers then there is no world, but we are not a sufficient condition for it; for him the world consists of ideas and relations among them that we did not, for the most part, produce. The problem for Dilman is that his only developed arguments separating Wittgenstein from idealism appear to be variants of the non-arbitrariness argument sketched above, and hence attack only absolute idealism. Now if the idealist tradition is distinguished from absolute idealism – and with the possible exception of Fichte one is hard pressed to find an absolute idealist – then Dilman’s attempted separation of Wittgenstein from idealism starts looking like a straw man. In fact, the Wittgenstein that Dilman presents certainly seems to hold the qualified idealism thesis above. That is, if we grant that language is a human product (and I’m ignoring here an odd and undefended assertion to the contrary on page 20), and couple this with the anti-realist consequences of Wittgenstein’s arguments, then it’s hard to see how Dilman’s Wittgenstein wouldn’t hold, along with Berkeley, to qualified idealism.

So Dilman’s attempted separation of Wittgenstein from idealism is unsuccessful, and I think that this leads to a serious tension later in the book. This tension arises with Dilman’s analysis of statements about the past, and his attempt to separate Wittgenstein’s position from the “partial idealism” that Anscombe finds in it. Borrowing Anscombe’s example, he tells us that:

This truth – for example that a wolf killed three deer in seven days, before there were human beings and their linguistic practices – does not depend on human language. It is independent of what we say in our language [….]. But it takes language to think it, to say it. The [fact has its] identity in our language. […]. The possibility of that fact, as of any other, does not exist independently of language. It is in ‘logical space’ that certain things are true or false, in other words, that they can be said. As I put it, [what] it makes sense to say, what can be true or false, presupposes a ‘dimension of reality’ which characterizes our life and world (116).

There seem to be two incompatible claims here; one that facts like that about the wolf are independent of what we say in language, the other that the “possibility of that fact, as of any other, does not exist independently of language”. The obvious problem is that a fact cannot exist independently of its possibility. This is bad, but things quickly get worse when, two pages later, Dilman reverses himself, remarking that:

Of course it is possible for it to be the case that a wolf ate three sheep before there were human beings and human language. Who in his senses would deny this! (118)

One searches for textual clues that might mitigate the damage. Instead, Dilman begins repeating both of the conflicting claims (cf. 125, 128-9, 136-7, 151). Perhaps sensing the tension, he at times backs-off to a weaker position:

for [things] to be capable of being the object of our thoughts and of what we say, even when what we think and say may be false, they must fall within the universe of discourse of the language we speak (150, cf. also129).

Now if this were all that Wittgenstein was telling us, his philosophy would have to be counted as a major disappointment. Of course it’s not, and Dilman knows it. The problem is that when he tries to go beyond this, he seems unable to avoid asserting that the possibility of things both is and is not language-dependent. And one reason for this tension, I suggest, is that once his argument against idealism is seen to be a straw man, he’s got little to block the claim that Wittgenstein is an idealist, apart from making what look for all the world like realist assertions. The result of this isn’t an undermining of the realist/idealist distinction, but rather a painful attempt to adopt both of two incompatible positions. Which is a pity, because the opening chapters of this book offer much to like, and this only makes it harder to watch as Dilman gets entangled in the very knots he wants to cut.