Wittgenstein, Theory and the Arts

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Allen, Richard and Malcolm Turvey (eds.), Wittgenstein, Theory and the Arts, Routledge, 2001, 312 pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-415-22875-1.

Reviewed by Ted Cohen, University of Chicago


This is an interesting collection of eleven essays, written by ten authors, a little more than half of whom are academic philosophers, while the others are other scholars of the humanities. The two editors, Richard Allen and Malcolm Turvey have collaborated on an introductory essay, and each of them has written a separate piece. The other authors are Charles Altieri, P. M. S. Hacker, Oswald Hanfling, John Hyman, Graham McFee, Louis A. Sass, Severin Schroeder, and Ben R. Tilghman. There is not space in this review to discuss all eleven essays, and so the review discusses only those essays the reviewer thought he might have something useful to say about.

When a contemporary philosopher, especially one of an analytical persuasion, writes about other philosophers, he is likely to do one of two things: If the subject is another contemporary philosopher, especially one still living, the philosopher is apt to be critical, perhaps even concluding that the subject-philosopher has made errors. If the subject is a philosopher from times gone by, then the contemporary philosopher is apt to engage in exegesis, regarding the older text almost as a scripture, something to be pondered, interpreted, and absorbed, but not as a philosophical treatise awaiting possible refutation. Wittgenstein has long since become something of an icon, and the arguments stirred by his writing are, typically, arguments over how to interpret him, and seldom over whether he was correct in what he wrote. None of the eleven essays in this collection is much concerned to argue against Wittgenstein; their task, rather, is to apply Wittgenstein’s philosophy. In their introductory essay the editors say, plainly:

To date, Wittgenstein’s later philosophy has had little if any lasting influence on humanistic disciplines that study the arts….
The primary goal of this volume of essays is to help in the task of rectifying this situation by making Wittgenstein’s later philosophy better known and understood to scholars in these disciplines. (p. 1)

The idea of applying Wittgenstein to the arts can seem anomalous, for Wittgenstein does not seem to have a system or a theory that might be deployed here and there; and in fact the presumably Wittgensteinian idea that no system or theory should be deployed is, perhaps, the leading claim of this collection, one embodied in many of the individual essays. As the editors see it, Wittgenstein is against theory, and when his influence is brought to bear on the arts, it will militate against theories.

The background for this collection is set in the editors’ introductory essay, “Wittgenstein’s Later Philosophy: a Prophylaxis against Theory,” and in P. M. S. Hacker’s “Wittgenstein and the Autonomy of Humanistic Understanding.” A leading idea of these essays is that Wittgenstein recommends leaving things as they are, appreciating them as they are, and not disfiguring them by trying to understand them in terms of any would-be theory that will misconstrue them in the interest of some allegedly deeper analysis. Thus if there is some relevant Wittgensteinian theory, it is the thesis that in these matters, at least, theory is inappropriate and misguided.

There are various ways in which one might bring Wittgenstein to bear on questions in the arts and the humanities. One might enunciate putative theses of Wittgenstein’s, and then apply them; or one might gather Wittgenstein’s scattered remarks about works of art, and try to make them cohere. But another thing one might do is to write about the arts, as it were, in the spirit of Wittgenstein, as if one had embodied Wittgenstein’s sensibility and commitments. Two of the collection’s essays attempt this. Especially welcome is Ben R. Tilghman’s “Language and Painting, Border Wars and Pipe Dreams.” In “Wittgensteinian” prose reminiscent of O. K. Bowsma, Tilghman takes on the idea, common in current writing, that painting is, or is in, a language. In his clear, level-headed, and acute examination, Tilghman argues that language is language, painting is painting, and that it can be profoundly misleading to reconstrue paintings as if they were words. This is a brief, efficient, and incisive essay that should be confronted by anyone who is comfortable speaking of the “language of painting.” Tilghman does not address the possibility of arguing as Nelson Goodman did, that both words and paintings are embedded in what Goodman called ‘symbol systems’, and Tilghman himself notes this, but it is clear that any Goodmanian thesis must deal with Tilghman’s observations.

In a similar vein, arguing that things are just what they are, Severin Schroeder, in “The Coded-Message Model of Literature,” mounts a withering attack on the structuralist-poststructuralist-deconstructionist conviction that literary works have hidden, concealed, oblique “meanings,” distinguishable from what they seem, in themselves to mean. As is well known, there have come to be, first in literary studies, then in art history and music, profound-looking efforts at what is called ‘theory’. Schroeder’s short essay is an excellent corrective, in my opinion, getting right to the point and showing, first, how unmotivated such “theory” is, and, second, how implausible its results can be.

The most curious essay is Turvey’s “Is Scepticism a ‘Natural Possibility’ of Language? Reasons to be Sceptical of Cavell’s Wittgenstein.” It appears, I think, because although Allen and Turvey have said that Wittgenstein’s work has had little influence on studies of the arts, in fact Cavell has been engaged in exactly that kind of study for more than 30 years. He is, thus, a counterexample to their assessment, and he is their chief competitor in undertaking such studies.

Turvey argues that Cavell is mistaken to concentrate so much on Wittgenstein’s relevance to the general question of scepticism, accusing Cavell of having a kind of grand idea which he imposes on Wittgenstein’s text. This seems to me to misunderstand, or at best to distort, both Wittgenstein and Cavell. Suppose it is true that, among other things, and perhaps above all the rest, Wittgenstein is an opponent of theory. At the time of Wittgenstein’s writing, both in epistemology and the philosophy of language, very many of the theories abroad were either advancing or attacking scepticism in one form or another. If scepticism, in some form or other, has been a feature of ordinary human life, at least for three centuries, as Cavell has been arguing, then why not take Wittgenstein to be trying to establish that human fact against philosophical, theoretical attempts either to restate it, or to defeat it?

The volume exhibits one striking omission. Despite the editors’ conviction that Wittgenstein’s writing has had little influence in the philosophy of art, not long after the publication of the Philosophical Investigations, Morris Weitz published his prize-winning essay, “The Role of Theory in Aesthetics,” in which he explicitly invoked an argument of Wittgenstein’s in order to attempt a wholesale reconfiguration of the philosophy of art. By now, half a century later, Weitz’ essay may seem somewhat crude, or at least naïve, but there have been and continue to be countless responses to that essay. Weitz took Wittgenstein to be suggesting, by implication, that the diverse things called works of art be left as they are, and not forced into an artificial category in the interest of a “theory of art.” He went on to explore the concept of art, as he saw it, doing his best to describe the concept as it is used in practice and without regard to philosophical urges to generalize. Weitz’ distinctions between descriptive and evaluative uses of the concept, and his observations concerning what is being done when someone asserts or denies that an object is a work of art have been discussed in detail, and often contested, but they seem to me to remain one of the first and most useful attempts at Wittgensteinian philosophy of art. The influential work of Arthur Danto and George Dickie can be read, naturally enough, as responses to Weitz. The volume’s neglect of Weitz and the enormous literature his essay led to seems to me an unfortunate feature of the book. (Danto and Dickie are mentioned once each, in Graham McFee’s essay.)

The idea of Wittgenstein as an anti-theorist stands behind much of the volume. The editors make much of Wittgenstein’s objection to the deployment of an Urphänomen. The idea comes from Goethe, according to the editors, and it is “…a preconceived idea that becomes a model or prototype to be used in the description of all phenomena,” the kind of thesis-before-the-facts that Wittgenstein finds in Freud (p. 19). And it is just this that Turvey objects to in Cavell, insisting that Cavell’s ubiquitous attention to scepticism in Wittgenstein’s writing is just that kind of “all-encompassing imperiousness.” One wonders whether Wittgenstein himself, at least as the editors understand him, has not deployed such a master idea himself, namely the idea that there are no master ideas. This is reminiscent of a strand in Dewey’s philosophy, namely the crusade against distinctions. Dewey’s enormous corpus is permeated with its objections to the fact/value distinction, the distinction between means and ends, the separation of the necessary from the contingent, and so on. Of course we should want to recognize “myths” as such when they occur in philosophy and elsewhere, and we are prudent to beware of them, but myth-detection can itself be a kind of philosophical crusade, and sometimes the crusade is unaccountably selective. Here is a possible example from Hacker’s background essay:

Hacker says,

Understanding the expressions of a language is mastery of the rule-governed techniques of their use. The attempt to reduce understanding to stimulus-response correlations [sic] cannot account for what is understood, or for the ability that is acquired when the meaning of an expression is mastered.…Similarly, cognitive scientists’ attempt to explain the institution of language by reference to a ‘language of thought’ which the brain ‘knows’ and Chomskian theoretical linguists’ attempt to explain language acquisition by reference to prelinguistic ‘cognizing’ of a universal grammar of all humanly possible languages are equally incoherent.

Perhaps Hacker is right about this. But he himself says this:

‘Following according to a rule’ is fundamental to the institution of language. To learn a language is to master the rule-governed techniques of the uses of its expressions. To understand the meaning of an expression is to be able to use it correctly. One cannot follow a rule which one does not know or understand. Hence the rules which determine and are constitutive of the meanings of expressions cannot be unknown, awaiting future discovery. [The quotations of Hacker are from pp. 60-62.]

Suppose we asked a perfectly competent speaker, say, of English, when it is appropriate to say ‘I apologize’, when ‘I’m sorry’, when to tell a joke (and how to tell it), when to speak ironically or metaphorically. No doubt all these things are parts of “language games” and “forms of life” (whatever, exactly, Wittgenstein meant by those terms), but it seems to me extremely unlikely that the speaker could give anything like a comprehensive articulation of what “rules” he is following when he does these things. What, then, does it mean to say that he knows and understands those rules? I am myself an inveterate joke-teller, and sometimes I go wrong in supposing that the time is appropriate for telling a joke, or for telling a particular joke. When I have such a misfire, have I somehow broken a “rule” that is known to me?

When people succeed in acting together, when they communicate, when they engage in any number of activities requiring some measure of mutuality, some coordination, there is a strong temptation to suppose that this can be explained only on the assumption that those people are following some mutually-understood rules. And it is yet a further assumption that the participants know these rules, in some strong sense of the word ‘know’. Thus the uses of language are thought to be like moves in games we might engage in, as if making a joke or speaking ironically were like playing chess or baseball. In the first place, it isn’t at all obvious that all the games we play require and exemplify rules, in any univocal sense of ‘rule’, and in the second place, it is even less obvious that using language is like that. One might say, echoing Wittgenstein: don’t just assume this business about known rules, but look and see.

The confident assertion that there must be known rules underlying our manifold uses of language sounds uncomfortably like the deployment of a master idea, an idea to which the facts must be made to conform. It sounds like an Urphänomen.

All the essays in this collection are worth reading, and there is no space to discuss more than a few. One exceptionally subtle essay, which I can mention only in passing, is Louis A. Sass’ “Wittgenstein, Freud and the Nature of Psychoanalytic Explanation.” Wittgenstein’s opinion of Freud’s project, and his ambivalent attitude toward Freud in general are subtle and complicated matters. Sass understands that Wittgenstein himself had a project, just as much as did Freud, even if Wittgenstein’s project was to undercut ones like Freud’s, and Sass’ articulation of the differences and similarities between Wittgenstein and Freud are instructive.

A final crabby note: $75 seems far too much for this volume, especially given the shoddy editorial work and proofreading which have left the text marred by misprints, unsecured bibliographic references, and annoying and misleading redundancies.