Wollstonecraft, Mill and Women's Human Rights

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Eileen Hunt Botting, Wollstonecraft, Mill and Women's Human Rights, Yale University Press, 2016, 306pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300186154.

Reviewed by Helen McCabe, University of Warwick


'The rights of women are no other than the rights of human beings'.[1] In this very interesting study, Eileen Hunt Botting traces this idea from two of its earliest sources -- what she describes as the Christian 'metaphysical and deontological grounding for women's human rights' found in the work of Mary Wollstonecraft, and the liberal utilitarian 'secular foundation' of women's human rights found in the work of John Stuart Mill (18-19). She considers the implication of these two different schools of thought for contemporary feminist campaigners seeking to 'allege' women's human rights which do not currently exist in international or domestic law, and she traces the impact of the work of these two thinkers (particularly A Vindication of the Rights of Women and The Subjection of Women) in their historical context and through a range of non-European campaigns for women's human rights up to the present day.

Hunt Botting begins with a general discussion of the problems associated with human rights in general, and the conception of 'women's' human rights specifically. Her characterisation of Wollstonecraft's as an 'insider' perspective and Mill's as an 'outsider' (15-16) is very interesting, though it could have been applied more throughout the book. (It is also slightly complicated by the fact that almost all of Mill's feminist texts were co-authored by Harriet Taylor, who presumably had more of an 'insider' perspective.) Hunt Botting then turns to what she calls a 'Philosophical Genealogy of Women's Human Rights' from the very earliest theorists of human rights, and their scant mention of women's rights (always conceived in relation to chastity), through to Wollstonecraft's ground-breaking Vindication and its reception in post-revolutionary France and America, and on to Mill's Subjection and On Liberty, the influence of Taylor on his feminism, and the potential (unacknowledged) influence of Wollstonecraft on both. This chapter lays this historical groundwork for the more theoretical chapter to come, showing the unique position of Wollstonecraft and Mill (despite neither being the first advocate of women's rights) as formulating two different approaches to the problem and as having unprecedented impact on their contemporaries world-wide and on future historical audiences.

The second chapter categorises both Wollstonecraft's and Mill's theories of women's human rights as 'naturalistic' (that is, grounded in women's status as humans). It goes on to explore the problems inherent in both Wollstonecraft's 'big-tent' but fundamentally Christian approach, and Mill's secular account which nevertheless is in danger of allowing rights to be violated in the interests of maximising general happiness. This is one of the strongest chapters, combining a clear analytical framework with sympathetic and sophisticated understandings of their work, and displaying an excellent understanding and use of historical context.

Hunt Botting then goes on (in Chapter 3) to explore Wollstonecraft's and Mill's demands for universal education, not just in reading, writing and arithmetic, etc., but in the moral cultivation of 'androgynous' virtues by both the sexes, and their radical contention that gender stereotypes and norms contribute to 'bad' education (of both sexes). It is not wholly clear why the emphasis is solely on education (and on Mill's and Wollstonecraft's philosophies of education) -- though these are undoubtedly important and interesting elements of their work -- rather than on a wider range of women's human rights. However, this chapter does contain an excellent, theoretically astute and historically sensitive account of their views of gender and gender-formation, and how Mill and Wollstonecraft's urging of women to adopt androgynous virtue is not a case of them trying to turn women into men. Hunt Botting's erudite account of their 'feminist liberalism' (a very useful phrase in itself) makes a useful contribution to the question of what claims either Wollstonecraft or Mill have to being seen as 'radical' feminists. The chapter ends with a section on 'Effective yet Ethical Argumentation for Women's Human Right to Education' which considers the extent to which Wollstonecraft's and Mill's arguments are conditioned by their (male) audience and the political, persuasive objectives of their works. It also cautions modern practitioners not to forget to emphasise that education is an intrinsic good for women and men, since men as well as women benefit from increased female education.

Chapter 4 confronts the problem of cultural bias in Wollstonecraft's and Mill's works and their narratives of women's 'progress', where the parlous state of the contemporary European woman is likened to, and (unfavourably) contrasted with, what is already considered by them and their audience to be the 'backward' or 'barbarian' condition of women outside of Europe and America, particularly in the Orient. Hunt Botting then traces the history of this problem through the reception and adoption of the ideas of Wollstonecraft and Mill. She notes in particular the 'ideal' of the 'intellectual' marriage between Mill and Taylor. She also points out that non-European feminist campaigners confronted the colonial idea of their own 'barbarity', linking the campaign for women's rights with the increasing Westernisation of their countries (towards which they had somewhat ambivalent feelings, seeing it as synonymous with a positive 'modernity' and also mourning the loss of their own cultures and languages).

Hunt Botting brings in a variety of fascinating reception narratives from India, Russia, South Africa, Chile and Argentina to show the different ways in which these problematic analogies were confronted in non-European countries trying to formulate an indigenous argument for, and account of, women's human rights. Mill's colonialism is often an elephant in the room, and Hunt Botting does an excellent job of defining exactly what it amounted to, and of pointing out what the problems with it not only are, but were for the transmittance and acceptance of his work. Nonetheless, her argument that the mention of 'Egyptian slave-drivers' in Wollstonecraft's and other feminists' works was not just a reference to the Old Testament, but also to the Ottoman Empire (which contemporaneously occupied Egypt) was less convincing.

The final chapter concerns 'human stories', using Wollstonecraft's semi-autobiographical fiction and Mill's Autobiography (and stories of their reception), alongside a number of other forms of female personal narratives, historical and present, from across the globe, to consider the role of personal narratives in forming the basis for arguments justifying universal women's human rights. Wollstonecraft's shifting status as a feminist 'meme' is charted, alongside the idealisation of the intellectual marriage of equals exemplified in Mill and Taylor's relationship, providing an aspirational model for other egalitarian sexual relationships (though Hunt Botting might buy into the thought that Mill and Taylor never had a sexual relationship even after marriage a little too un-critically -- Mill's account in the Autobiography clearly only refers to their refraining from sexual relations whilst Taylor's first husband was alive[2]). Indeed, given this joint influence on later campaigners for women's human rights, given Mill's acknowledgement of Taylor as his co-author (which Hunt Botting rightly notes), and given that this probably also extended to Subjection, which though published after Taylor's death was penned before it, perhaps Hunt Botting ought to have spoken of Mill and Taylor's account of women's human rights.

This is a fascinating chapter since the stories it contains are so interesting -- and, indeed, could probably form a book of their own. Moreover, the shift from story-telling to a theoretical questioning of whether individual accounts of female experience can be used to found women's human rights is an interesting one, speaking to a set of intersectional problems with any idea of 'universal' 'human' rights.

From this sketch it ought to be clear that though all the chapters deal with Wollstonecraft and Mill, and/or their reception as theorists of, and campaigners for, women's human rights, the 'thread' of the book is not wholly clear, with each chapter dealing with a disparate, though interesting, problem. There is a certain tension in the book between charting the accounts of women's human rights given by Wollstonecraft and Mill, charting the reception of those accounts, and using those accounts and experiences to make positive policy proposals for contemporary campaigners for women's human rights. At times, this is very successfully negotiated, and in a number of different ways. At other times, the advice for application is very brief, or seems disconnected from the previous discussion.

There is no final conclusion which pulls all these threads together, in terms either of lessons to be learned from Mill and Wollstonecraft in terms of practical application or of an overall assessment of the approach of each to the question of women's human rights. Instead the book ends relatively suddenly with a mention of Malala Yousafzai and what appears to be a criticism of her as 'just another girl, with flaws like any other person', flaws which were apparently shown in her 'positioning of her politics against the Taliban, introduc[ing] a strain of antifundamentalist rhetoric into her speeches and writings, which angered her enemies' and apparently 'risked losing her hard-won image as a peacemaker who seeks to reconcile her Muslim faith with feminism, especially among fundamentalist followers of Islam' (248). One might, however, ask whether this is a 'flaw', and whether Yousafzai ought to be concerned with not 'angering her enemies', or with abiding by the expectations of fundamentalists. It certainly is true that Yousafzai's 'personal yet political predicament shows both the enduring promise and real difficulties of women's human rights advocacy', but it is perhaps verging on sentimental to suggest that such experience is a case of 'personal trial' and 'human error' 'In the school of Mill and Wollstonecraft' which enables one to 'better defend the human rights of women' (248). This ending is a shame, as the rest of book is thoughtful, insightful and illuminates women's experiences of conceptualising and campaigning for women's human rights.

Hunt Botting notes that this is the first full-length treatment of both Mill's and Wollstonecraft's arguments for women's human rights. One could add that it is one of very few pieces to compare their views on anything -- evidently a serious lacuna in existing scholarly literature.

Overall, this is a well-written, well-researched and extremely interesting book. Hunt Botting evidently has a scholarly grasp of the historical and intellectual context of both Wollstonecraft's and Mill's arguments for women's human rights -- her explanations both of their period and their ideas are exemplary, and the book is worth reading just for these (particularly in Chapters 1, 2 and 3). Her account of the reception of both Vindication and Subjection is fascinating (particularly in Chapters 4 and 5), though perhaps more to a historian than a lawyer or political theorist. (This said, I think there are a few errors in interpreting the historical data -- the reproduced portrait of Wollstonecraft, for instance, does not depict 'Mrs Godwin' as a 'cross-dressing philosopher', as Hunt Botting argues, but only as wearing a fashionable hat (128-129). Similarly 'Mrs Godwin' is not trying to make her more 'male', but giving her what would then have been considered her proper name.) There is much in it for the student of the history of political thought in general, as well as people specifically interested in Wollstonecraft and Mill, their contexts, their ideas and their reception. There is also much in it of use for the contemporary student of, campaigner for, or theoriser of women's human rights who is considering what approaches to utilise in defending, positing and campaigning for these rights, and who is seeking to be grounded in a sense of more than two centuries of universal struggle, particularly by a whole army of characters whose lives and idea come to life in these pages.

[1] Harriet Taylor and John Stuart Mill, Papers on Women's Rights, Collected Works XXI (Toronto University Press, 1984), p. 386.

[2] Mill, Early Draft of the Autobiography, CW I (Toronto University Press, 1983), p. 236.