Woody Allen: An Essay on the Nature of the Comical

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Vittorio Hösle, Woody Allen: An Essay on the Nature of the Comical, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 96pp., $18.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268031046.

Reviewed by John Morreall, College of William and Mary


Martian engineers designing a human race without having seen the actual one might think it could get along perfectly well without a sense of humor.  And if they consulted the history of Western philosophy, they'd find little to persuade them otherwise.  Apart from Bergson's book Laughter, what we find is mostly short incidental passages about laughter and humor, with few good words about either (exceptions include Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas).  Plato, for example, said that comedy is based on feelings of malice, a "pain in the soul," and Hobbes analyzed laughter as an expression of "sudden glory."  In the words of Rodney Dangerfield, humor didn't get no respect.

Vittorio Hösle's little book on Woody Allen is a refreshing counterbalance to the traditional neglect of humor and comedy by philosophers.  Appearing in English in the journal Film and Philosophy in 2000, it was then published in German as a book in 2002, and then republished in English as this book.  Hösle counts laughter as "one of the most controversial and intriguing topics in philosophy," and Woody Allen as "a profoundly philosophical comedian" (p. 2).  Like the witty neurotic character he plays in his films, the man Woody Allen is concerned with the big philosophical questions -- authenticity, the nature of morality, death, God, and the value of art.  His themes are those of the existentialists, which is why he so often refers to Russian novels, as in the movie Love and Death.

The philosophical dimension of Allen's films, according to Hösle, raises them high above the comedies of his American predecessors and puts him in the "same intellectual rank as Aristophanes or Molière" (p. x).  Here aficionados of classic 1930s and 1940s comedies might disagree.  In Pursuits of Happiness: The Hollywood Comedy of Remarriage, for example, Stanley Cavell finds lots of philosophical significance in them.  But even so, Allen's comedies rank high on the philosophy-meter.

Making his films even more interesting is the fact that "Allen's philosophical vision corresponds exactly to a certain moment in the history of philosophy, namely that moment in the late twentieth century when French existentialism's concept of freedom and its ethically motivated atheism had become profoundly problematic because they seemed to undermine any belief in an objective ethics" (p. 6).  While many philosophers still espoused atheism, the triumphant tone of nineteenth and early twentieth century atheism had given way to the pessimistic mood which Allen's films capture so well.

Before getting into a detailed discussion of the films, Hösle devotes a quarter of his book to reviewing traditional theories of laughter, humor, comedy, the comic, and "the comical," (if that's different from the comic).  Unfortunately, he doesn't distinguish these carefully.  Of the superiority, relief, ambivalence, and incongruity theories, he says that only the last provides a basis for a normative theory of the comic, that is, a theory of when finding something funny is an intelligent and moral response to it.  In addition to reasonable, tasteful laughter, there is stupid laughter and laughter expressing schadenfreude, for example, which, presumably, we do not approve of.  Though laughter at deformed people was common centuries ago, Hösle says that "sometime in human history" (it was during the Enlightenment) that became vulgar.  The malicious element in laughter was subjected to moral and aesthetic criticism, making laughter more civilized.  One form the new sensibility took was the simple rule that we should not laugh at people for what they have no control over, such as their looks or their disabilities.

Hösle builds most of his theoretical comments on Henri Bergson's theory of laughter as social corrective, which combines the incongruity theory with the superiority theory.  Though Hösle's discussion is not, as the book cover promises, a "theory of the comical," it is sufficient for discussing the films of Woody Allen.

In his philosophical analysis of laughter, Hösle presents intriguing speculations about the difference between laughter and smiling (p. 13).  According to a widely accepted theory originated by Jan van Hooff, smiling evolved from the silent closed-mouth facial display of early apes, while laughter evolved from the open-mouth panting facial display.  The closed-mouth face that became the smile was a way of signaling submission and appeasement, while the open-mouth display was an invitation to play.  Today, smiles and laughs are often intermixed.  Hösle suggests that perhaps "the laugher who first smiles asks in a certain sense for forgiveness for what he is going to do, partly to avoid retaliation on another occasion, but partly, perhaps, also because even if such retaliation is not to be feared he has an unconscious insight into his affinity with the comic object" (p. 13).  In laughing at people, we are aware of what we share with them, and our smiles indicate our realization that we are partly laughing at ourselves, or at the human condition.  Ideas like these are hard to test, of course, but they are a much needed counterbalance to the crude superiority theories of Plato and Hobbes.

When Hösle turns to analyzing Woody Allen's movies, he focuses on the "Woody persona," the character-type so often played by the actor Woody Allen in his films.  The main features of this type are his tormented relation with women and with his own sexuality, his strange mixture of intellectual triumph and defeat, and his way of alternating between being funny/witty and being funny/laughable.  We both laugh with Woody as he makes clever observations, and laugh at him for being a neurotic schlemiel (habitual bungler) and a schlimazel (born loser).  I am inserting these terms here.  Curiously, Hösle doesn't make use of the rich Yiddish comic vocabulary and doesn't connect Allen's comedy with traditional Jewish humor.

Although Woody Allen is interested in the big questions of philosophy, "he remains faithful to the limitation of comedy, from the New Comedy onwards, to topics that do not concern the highest, the ruling classes, whose problems are reserved for tragedy" (p. 59).  The Woody character is fundamentally apolitical (p. 47).

With Allen's thorough knowledge of film history to draw on, and his own innovative style, Hösle says, he "recovers a fullness of the comic that had been lost by high art … for more than two millennia" (p. 7).

Although most of Hösle's praise for Woody Allen is reasonable as film criticism, he is prone to hyperbole, as on page 43:

Although not academic, the Woody persona is thus essentially an intellectual.  In as early a film as Take the Money and Run, the criminal Virgil Starkwell shows his belief in the power of the word when he tries to rob a bank with the help of a written note -- a note, though, so badly written that gun is read by the employees as gub and causes long hermeneutical discussions up to the vice president.  His attempt to flee from prison with a pistol carved out of a bar of soap that then gets sudsy in the rain demonstrates again his trust in form over matter.

Tracing these scenes to Allen's "belief in the power of the word" and "trust in form over matter" here seems like silly pedantry.  Not everything in Allen's films has philosophical significance.  I find it more insightful to simply call Virgil Starkwell a schlemiel.

The tendency toward pedantry shows up also in some of Hösle's writing, as in the redundant "indispensable prerequisite" (p. 4), "too overopinionated" (p. 66), and "appearance of a deus ex machina from above" (p. 54).  Why write that "Woody Allen has succeeded in impersonating a certain type of comic hero," when you mean that he has played a certain type of comic hero?

This small problem aside, Hösle has done an admirable job of organizing and discussing themes in Allen's movies and relating them to his written work.  Allen is a master of joke techniques, particularly inflation and deflation -- the sudden juxtaposition of something trivial after something sublime.  "Eternal nothingness is O.K. if you are dressed for it," for instance, and "Not only is there no God, but try getting a plumber on weekends" (p. 34).  Hösle is particularly good when discussing the gags that appeal to academics, such as the scene in Annie Hall where Allen's character is waiting in a theater line and gets into an argument about Marshall McLuhan with another man.  McLuhan himself appears, and takes Woody's side (p. 41).

If Vittorio Hösle gets to write a second edition of this charming book, he might look in more detail at the current philosophical literature on humor and, even if the book remains short, add a bibliography and an index.