Word and World: Practices and the Foundation of Language

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Patricia Hanna and Bernard Harrison, Word and World: Practices and the Foundation of Language, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 432pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521537444

Reviewed by Anat Matar, Tel Aviv University


The bottom line is: this is a first-rate book, a scholarly, clear, illuminating and thorough study in contemporary philosophy of language.

Hanna and Harrison’s aim is to offer a third way of solving the language-world dilemma; one which cuts through the realist, representation-based explanation of language’s relation to the world, and a relativist, intra-linguistic, coherentist one. Their method follows the well known advice (attributed to Ramsey), “in philosophy, when facing a dilemma – find the root common to both disputants and negate it”. Both horns of the dilemma have been widely discussed in the philosophical literature of the last fifty years at least. What is new in the present book is that the criticism is launched from an explicitly stated standpoint – one that negates what both criticized positions have in common. This standpoint enables the reader to follow Hanna and Harrison’s detailed arguments and evaluate them. I myself found most of them, not all, very convincing.

The common position that is being negated is one that sees no third player in the word-world game. Having discarded mentalism, many philosophers of language, trying to understand the relationship between language and reality, believed that a middle term must lead to the pitfalls exposed already by previous appeals to the mental realm. The alternative proposed is based on the indispensability of the notion of practice in any account of language and its relation to the world. This in itself is not a novelty; we have known such proposals, in various guises, since at least the 1920s, and certainly since the writings of the later Wittgenstein. What is remarkable in the present book, then, is the way it proceeds from this initial proposal to evaluate and criticize its rivals, thus gradually deepening our understanding of the consequences of the appeal to practice in any philosophical account of language.

Hanna and Harrison’s most forceful and successful analysis is directed towards what they call Referential Realism, the view that meaning is achieved through a direct association of linguistic elements with independent fragments of the “real world”. The attack on this position is accomplished through what is labeled in the book “Wittgenstein’s Slogan”, that “logic must take care of itself” – the opening words of the Notebooks 1914-16, later appearing in the Tractatus (5.473). These remarks were made by Wittgenstein a propos of Russell’s attempts to transcend language and anchor it in pieces of reality. Wittgenstein’s insight was basically that meaning must be prior to truth, and hence that an account of the meaning of statements cannot rely on previously “given” reference. The whole of Chapter 4 of Word and World consists in an impressive analysis of Russell’s and the early Wittgenstein’s positions on the matter. Its conclusion is that the Tractatus’ failure can be attributed to the fact that this work itself was an example of Referential Realism. I find both the analysis and its conclusion very convincing. Hanna and Harrison do not attempt to offer an exegesis of Wittgenstein’s later work and to argue (as I myself would) that Wittgenstein clung to this “slogan” throughout his lifetime, while shifting, updating and loosening the concept of logic in order to accommodate it to his later ideas on the centrality of practice for language. They do, however, endorse “the programme announced by Wittgenstein’s Slogan: the programme of showing that, and how, ‘Logic’ (that is, everything that concerns the fitness for truth or falsity of the sentential sign) can ’take care of itself’“ (93), that is, that the “slogan” can be interpreted in a way that makes it very relevant today. Indeed, it is the way the “slogan” is used in the book that is so thought-provoking. Hanna and Harrison virtually divide the contemporary analytic arena into two groups of philosophers: “Russellians” and “Wittgensteinians”, i.e., those who still wish to anchor language in some sort of external, independent reality that is directly connected to meaning, and those who deny this possibility as senseless. (But see a reservation regarding this terminology on p. 46.) The best-known controversy along these lines is of course that regarding the relationship of a name to its bearer, where Kripke naturally represents the hard core of the Russellian attitude. Chapters 5-7 deal extensively with this issue.

However, I do not wish, in this review, to go into the details of the analysis of any particular topic, but to suggest a reading of the general strategy. For what I find fascinating in the move taken by Hanna and Harrison is its surprising resemblance to the one taken by Russell himself, versus Frege, in “On Denoting”. Although Hanna and Harison discuss the differences between Frege and Russell’s positions, they don’t mention Frege’s principle “never to ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition” (Frege, Foundations of Arithmetic, p. x). This “context principle” is often seen as one of the founding moves of analytic philosophy. It is not merely a rejection of atomism and mentalism; it is a methodological decision to answer metaphysical questions by looking at our language, by understanding concepts as words, and words as belonging to linguistic structure. (Cf., e.g., Michael Dummett, Origins of Analytical Philosophy, p. 5.)

Russell’s “trick” in “On Denoting” is, in a sense, to implement Frege’s principle more thoroughly and consistently than Frege himself. Of course, in another sense, Russell contradicts this principle completely – when he declares, e.g., that “all thinking has to start from acquaintance” (“On Denoting”, 104). This aspect of Russell’s position is precisely the one attacked later by “Wittgenstein’s slogan” and discussed in Word and World. Yet when Russell proposes a solution to a problem caused by Frege’s disloyalty to Leibniz’ principle of “salva veritate”, he implements a line of thinking remarkably close to that of Hanna and Harrison in their book. In both cases we find “corrections” to current theories of meaning that are suggested (implicitly) as implementations of Frege’s “context principle”. Russell presents his puzzle thus:

Now George IV wished to know whether Scott was the author of Waverly; and in fact Scott was the author of Waverly. Hence we may substitute Scott for the author or Waverly, and thereby prove that George IV wished to know whether Scott was Scott. (“On Denoting”, 110)

Russell’s solution to the puzzle is “very simple”, as he says. “The propositions ’Scott was the author of Waverly’… does not contain any constituent ’the author of Waverly’ for which we could substitute ’Scott’“ (“On Denoting”, 114). This is because words do not get their significance in isolation, but only in contexts of propositions – and Russell has shown in his article how to analyze the relevant proposition in such a way that none of its constituents is ’the author of Waverly’.

I believe that Hanna and Harrison’s principal argument against Referential Realism appeals precisely to this line of reasoning. Although speaking of the primacy of practices does not, prima facie, seem to be consistent with Frege’s “context principle”, I think that the “linguistic turn” that was initiated with the principle is not at all breached by the main argument of Word and World, but, on the contrary, strengthened. Moreover, it is precisely Russell’s way of interpreting the principle contra Frege that is implemented here, contra “Russellians”. Introducing a third term – ’practice’ – as intermediate between the traditional realist duo of ’word’ and ’world’, makes it impossible to ask for constituents of reality that are supposed to stand in correlation to the linguistic structure. This is the main argument, in a nutshell:

According to this model, there is no associative link between any member of any category of linguistic expressions and any extralinguistic entity, whether metaphysically or naturalistically conceived. More generally, the kind of relationship between language and the world that does obtain cannot, without the risk of serious misunderstanding, be described as any kind of “linkage” connecting “items” drawn respectively from two “realms”… What actually relates language to reality… is better conceived as a two-level process of engagement, or embedding: at the first level the engagement, or embedding, of linguistic expressions in practices; at the second level the engagement, or embedding, of practices in the matrix of natural conditions and circumstances, in and with respect to which they are carried on. (48)

The two-stage relationship enables us to see that questions about word-world relationship (questions about truth and falsity, primarily), indeed are separate from, and come after, a general understanding of the way linguistic expressions acquire their specific meanings, in various context of action. At any rate, truth cannot be seen as simple “mirroring”; exactly as in Russell’s “On Denoting”, for in most sentences, the analysis shows that there is no relevant linguistic structure to which the simple notion of correspondence could apply. Rather, we have to appeal to a network of connected actions, involving a mixture of “words” with bits of “world”. An interesting corollary of this result is a strong appeal to a “knowing-how” (practical knowledge) that cannot be reduced to any well-phrased assertoric “knowing-that”. This means that the theory of meaning many contemporary philosophers seek cannot actually be gained (and hence sought at all) – our knowledge of meanings is too deeply embedded in our actions and cannot be disentangled, made into a pure linguistic formula.

However, the appeal to those “bits of world” that play an important role in our practices is a bit misleading. Indeed I think that Hanna and Harrison’s only major problem in their account is that they present their solution as another version of realism, as they do in the book’s long Epilogue. Although they are happy to admit their anti-realism about, e.g., reference and concepts (349), Hanna and Harrison are convinced that on the whole, their proposal should be seen as a version of realism, metaphysical realism.

If metaphysical realism is, as Putnam puts it, the claim that the world is independent of any particular representation of it, then at the level of the constitution of linguistic practices we confront a world of which metaphysical realism is simply true. (352)

But despite their thoughtful and sincere attempts to explain, in the pages that follow the above quote, why their philosophical proposal can be seen as realist, I think that Hanna and Harrison do not succeed in conferring on their notion of the world the independence needed for a genuine realist position. Their world – I am happy to say, as an anti-realist – is strongly connected to our linguistic practices and cannot be disentangled from them. Indeed, there is no particular representation or the world that “captures” it, hence it may seem that the world is indeed independent of any particular representation of it – but, according to Hanna and Harrison themselves, the world is dependent on the ongoing linguistic practice, as fractured, multi-layered, multi-faceted and even inconsistent as it is. Such a view is, luckily, metaphysical indeed – but it is not a metaphysical realism.

One of the virtues of the book is its scope – the fact that practically all the significant views pertaining to the philosophy of language in the previous century are seriously and thoroughly discussed. Thus, apart from Russell and Wittgenstein, already mentioned, there are lengthy discussions of Quine, Putnam, Davidson, Dummett, Kripke, and McDowell. All the philosophical positions that are criticized are very fairly presented. This is true in particular of the “Russellian” positions, such as Quine’s or Kripke’s, and of every Referential Realist that is moved by anti-mentalist and anti-relativist motivations; but it is no less true of the more “idealist” position – with which, as I have just argued, Hanna and Harrison implicitly side. (See, e.g., a comment on usual misunderstandings by Anglophone readers of Saussure, Merleau-Ponty and Derrida, on p. 268.) In general, Hanna and Harrison repeat the modest statement that theirs is not an exegetical aim, thus defending themselves from unfair presentations of the philosophers they discuss – especially those that are relatively briefly mentioned.

In sum, this is a very impressive book, which I strongly recommend both for scholars and advanced students in the philosophy of language.


Dummett, M.A.E., Origins of Analytical Philosophy, 1993, London: Duckworth

Frege, G., The Foundations of Arithmetic, Translated by J.L. Austin, 1953: Blackwell

Russell, B., “On Denoting”, reprinted in Essays in Analysis, 1973, NY: George Braziller