Words Underway: Continental Philosophy of Language,

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Carolyn Culbertson, Words Underway: Continental Philosophy of Language, Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 140pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781786608055.

Reviewed by Beata Stawarska, University of Oregon


In Carolyn Culbertson's book, language is understood as basic to the constitution of the world in which humans dwell, rather than as an external tool for referring and communicating. She draws attention to the dual character of language -- it is a source of delight that fulfills our nature, but it can simultaneously be a source of linguistic alienation -- an inability to give expression to experience, or a feeling that the expression culminated in a failure. Even though linguistic alienation is arguably pervasive, it has not received a sustained treatment in classical philosophy of language. It follows that philosophers like Jacques Derrida or Julia Kristeva, who grappled with various aspects of linguistic alienation as well as with the evolving character of linguistic being (the idea that language is best captured, per the book's title, as words underway) have not been considered integral to the philosophy of language as a discipline. Culbertson writes:

Inevitably, readings by Russell, Frege, and Quine are found in the anthologies assigned in philosophy of language classes. One does not find readings by Heidegger, Gadamer, or Derrida, although each understood the theme of language to be central to their philosophical work. (4)

Similarly, the contributions on the theme of language made by feminist and postcolonial philosophers, who routinely engage phenomenology and hermeneutics, are missing from these anthologies. Culberton's goal is therefore threefold: to shed light on the development of Continental philosophy of language, to examine linguistic alienation within that development, and to clarify the conception of understanding within Continental philosophy of language as a partial response to the phenomenon of linguistic alienation. In the process, she considers the ethical and political questions related to having a voice within the deliberative process integral to modern liberal democracies, and the suffering associated with a failure to be a full participant in this process (11).

In chapter one, Culbertson begins to draw out a properly philosophical understanding of language -- one that examines the reader's task of understanding an inexhaustible text, or of listening to conversations that 'take us to unexpected places' (14). In the latter cases, language calls for a philosophical examination. Culbertson argues, unexpectedly, that the Louisiana writer and little-known author of several theoretical essays examining the subject of language in the 1960s and 70s, Walker Percy, 'most powerfully' expressed this need (14). Percy highlights the transformative and creative aspect of language acquisition. He likens it to an entry into a new world, as exemplified vividly by Helen Keller's experience of learning to speak following her loss of vision and hearing in early childhood (19). comments that, according to Percy, 'the world of the human language user  . . . unlike the nonhuman animal, is a world without gaps', and Keller's entry into a linguistic world enabled her to actively articulate its totality (20). It was somewhat surprising that Culbertson establishes the human/nonhuman binary in this chapter without any direct reference to literature in animal studies. At the end of the chapter, Culbertson comments about the lack of support for humanities education in the U.S. She writes: 'We now find ourselves, more than ever, lacking any sense for what is distinctive about the human's capacity for language' and suggests that this crisis of humanistic inquiry may also be an opportunity (27). However, a flourishing humanistic inquiry need not entail human linguistic exceptionalism. Arguably the suppression of humanities can even favor an uncritical, ideological divide between the human and the nonhuman assumed in some quarters of Continental philosophy.

In chapter two, Culbertson turns attention to the hermeneutic phenomenology of Heidegger and Gadamer. She highlights the character of linguistic non-immediacy in their work. Notably in Heidegger's essays in On the Way to Language, language is understood to be, at times, 'conspicuously unready-to-hand' and oppressing in the subject's failure to find the right word for something of value (32). We note here a shift from Heidegger's conception of the equiprimordiality of language and understanding from Being and Time (32). In the 'Dialogue on Language', for example, speaking is praised in its non-immediacy as a 'hint', one that 'opens up something inexhaustible for thought' (34). Culbertson contends that this understanding is best developed in the context of Gadamer's work (35). While Gadamer emphasizes the fundamental alienness of all texts, the words that we read provide a 'hint' that furthers the process of understanding (37-38). This hermeneutic insight can be brought to bear on Heidegger's 'Dialogue on Language'. In it, Heidegger and his interlocutor, a character representing a Japanese scholar, Tomio Tezuka, debate the translation of the German Sprache into Japanese. In their discussion of the Japanese Koto ba, they interrogate language within their linguistic and cultural horizons, and thereby reach a deeper understanding.

This is an understanding that develops as both speakers try to articulate what they already know to the other, and try to integrate what they learn from the other into what they know. The process of understanding that takes place in 'A Dialogue on Language' is . . . recognitive and cumulative in just the way that Gadamer describes. (40)

In finding that Gadamer's hermeneutic insights are performatively at work in Heidegger's text, Culbertson powerfully reveals that the non-immediacy of language need not obstruct the path of understanding; neither a defect nor an impenetrable mystery, it belongs to the dual character of language.

In chapter three, the focus shifts to linguistic trauma, as articulated especially in the literature of the Holocaust and its reception in Continental philosophy. Drawing on Blanchot, Culbertson notes that in the process of narration and documentation, experiences

would be preserved -- not so that the wounds of these profound losses would stay open, subjecting future generations to the same violence survivors themselves endured. Instead, through speaking and writing about them, survivors could distill from these traumatic experiences a new object of consciousness, finding some determinate meaning in them that could be passed on to others. (50)

Such therapeutic narration that works through the trauma of the Holocaust is forcefully embodied in Paul Celan's poems. For Celan, language served as an anchor -- it was 'reachable, near and not lost' (54). On the other hand, language sometimes failed to attain the level of determinate negation, it did not seem to resolve itself in a new meaning despite its rhythmic repetitions (54). Culbertson interprets this signifying loss as exemplary of linguistic alienation; language both works through and fails to document traumatic experiences. Drawing on Derrida's reading of Celan's poetry, she concludes that this alienation does not undermine what Blanchot calls 'the demand to write'; 'It deepens rather than diminishes' our need for empathic understanding as it seeks to reach the ear of an other (59).

Chapter four engages Continental feminism in an effort to grapple with women's language and women's silence. Its main contribution is to establish continuity between feminist and hermeneutic perspectives on language, against the worry that feminism assumes linguistic authenticity (women finding their true voice), and that it translates into identity politics. Drawing especially on Judith Butler's work, Culbertson counters that feminist philosophy of language recognizes the deep relational bonds we have with others, and also critically examines these bonds (74). Social critique does not deny the formative character of social relations. I found this discussion to be very helpful but somewhat limited in scope: Butler's works such as Excitable Speech, not only shift the terrain beyond identity politics, but they reflect on the workings of social power within language, and outline subversive reclamation of hate-speech as an effective emancipatory strategy. It seems that aligning her work with hermeneutics does not capture the full extent of her contributions to feminist philosophy of language, and does not consider how it advances the scholarship beyond Gadamer's key concern with reaching mutual understanding. The chapter's conclusion revisits Sandra Bartky's seminal study on Femininity and Domination to underscore the linguistic as well as emotional labor falling on women who are socialized to 'positively assess and reinforce what is being said by the other speaker' (77). While everyone benefits at times from such 'interlocutory caretaking', the problem emerges when women provide more linguistic-emotional support than they receive. This inequality engenders 'the loss of the creative labor of linguistic meaning-making', not unlike that found in Marx's discussion of the alienation of labor (79).

Chapter 5 adopts this feminist-hermeneutic approach to language to the question of women's silence in the context of depression, and it contrasts the latter with the 'omnipotence' routinely attributed to medical discourse. Whereas Bartky's study demonstrates that women are encouraged to silence their needs and concerns, the feminist psychologist Dana Crowley Jack demonstrates that habits of self-silencing correlate with depression, and make recovery more difficult (84). Confounded by what Maud Casey describes in her autobiography as the 'gray world of the inarticulate, where nothing takes shape, nothing has edges or clarity' (85), a depressed subject may easily defer to a doctor who authorizes and names her silence by means of the 'omnipotent' psychiatric discourse. Kristeva's psychoanalytic approach to depression, on the other hand, listens for the affective charge of the depressed subject's speech, and it facilitates the subject's ongoing process of meaning-making (94). Culbertson highlights the difficulty of this process -- for some women, 'it will be easier to swallow pills than to speak about their suffering' (99). The 'talking cure' does not simply negate loss or triumphantly rise over sadness, but it can make them livable (99). The unanswered question raised by this powerful chapter is whether Kristeva's account of psychosexual development, wherein all women equally mourn the loss of the archaic mother and need to find ways of signifying that loss, can address the social issue of women's self-silencing that preserves masculine privilege in a patriarchal society. A skeptic could argue, following the line of Butler's critique of Kristeva's semanalysis in Gender Trouble, that notions of archaic bonds to the maternal serve to naturalize the obstacles patriarchal society places in the way of women's self-expression. Considering that Kristeva's relation to feminist theory and practice is conflicted, I would have welcomed some reflection on the promises as well as the potential pitfalls of integrating her model of psychosexual development into a liberatory politics of discourse.

The concluding chapter 6 revisits the place of language within Continental philosophy, with an emphasis on Heidegger and Derrida. Continental philosophy has been accused of promoting linguistic determinism, easily captured by Rorty's statements that consciousness is but 'a disposition to use the language of our ancestors', and the notion of 'a deep sense of how things are' is itself linguistically determined (106). Some commentators sought to place Heidegger and Derrida within the 'linguistic turn' tradition, but Culbertson forcefully argues that this interpretation misses the complexity of their work. For example, Heidegger's discussion of unreadiness-to-hand in Being and Time, (for example, the malfunctioning of a hammer that disrupts the involvement in instrumental tasks, and thereby lights up the totality of the context of equipment, and ultimately of the world as such), applies to language's failure to work in the usual way, and illuminates the totality of the linguistic world. Culbertson's original interpretation of Heidegger's philosophy of language as one that integrates productive failures into its midst dispels the worry about linguistic determinism. Similarly, Derrida's Monolingualism of the Other illustrates that 'an originary alienation institutes every language as a language of the other' (116). While such universal statements may seem to justify coloniality as being an irreducible feature of any language (and not just of the French imposed as an official language onto the colonial Algeria, where Derrida spent his early years), Culbertson teases out a normative political-ethical argument that protests colonial domination. She notes that Derrida exposes the political manipulations at work in the colonial usurpation of the imperial language as being the colonizer's own (and not 'of the other') that drive hegemonic political power (118). According to Culbertson, it is the latter that 'produces this specific kind of alienation that is the subject of Derrida's normative political-ethical critique' (120). In sum, Heidegger and Derrida in various ways document the fulfillment and the frustrations associated with linguistic experience.

Culbertson is to be congratulated for a lucid, spirited, and masterfully executed defense of Continental philosophy of language. While we wait for an anthology reflecting this understudied area (an anthology would make a desirable sequel to this book), She has provided a helpful overview of key topics and texts, organizing them around a philosophically complex idea that language is equal parts a source of expression and frustration. She effectively synthesized several bodies of literature: classical Continental and feminist philosophical readings, Celan's poetry, relevant literature in feminist psychology, autobiographical writings on depression, and, to a degree, theoretical studies of epistemic injustice. It is impressive to witness philosophy and non-philosophy speak to each other regarding how language works and/or how it falters. Her argument embodies the style of Continental philosophers she engages like Heidegger and Derrida: language reveals the world not despite but because of its manifest failures; language is undecided between the recovery and the withdrawal of sense. This is not just a study but an exemplar of thinking about language in the Continental tradition. The presentation is driven by ideas and enlivened by imaginative examples; it eschews a purely exegetical analysis one sometimes finds in Continental philosophical scholarship. I would have hoped for a consideration of whether linguistic practices may disrupt the dominant ways in which masculinist and colonial forms of dominance impose the sovereign discourse of medical expertise or political hegemony; how can counter-discourses resist the modes of self-silencing imposed onto depressed or colonized subjects? Continental philosophy can shed light on questions of social power in language, and speak to the alienation as well as the transformation of subjects through speech. Ultimately, the question for Continental philosophy of language (and not only for Culbertson's excellent book) is: does it seek to describe or resist the world of social and linguistic inequality?