Writing the Book of the World

Placeholder book cover

Theodore Sider, Writing the Book of the World, Oxford University Press, 2011, 318pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199697908.

Reviewed by Timothy O'Connor and Nickolas Montgomery, Indiana University


Two issues have been heavily debated in recent metaphysics: a revival of the old meta-question concerning the substantivity of (at least some) metaphysical debates, and the first-order question of what we might or should mean by metaphysical 'fundamentality.' Theodore Sider addresses these and related matters with great care, sophistication, clarity, and originality. Through most of the book, he is concerned to show that there is substantive debate in almost every branch of traditional metaphysics. Along the way, he also sketches and partly argues for a particular, unabashedly realist first-order metaphysical view of the world. One could naturally split his book into two parts. The first motivates, explicates, and defends his preferred account of fundamentality. The second applies his new framework to various debates about ontology, logic, time, and modality. We will first discuss Sider's framework and then turn a critical eye to some of its applications.

At the heart of Sider's account is a primitive metaphysical concept of 'structure,' intended to be a cross-categorial generalization of David Lewis's notion of the 'naturalness' of those properties that play a role in good inductive generalizations and scientific theorizing. He argues that we can grasp this notion of structure, which is closely associated with a notion of metaphysical fundamentality, through the inferential role it plays, some of which he details in Chapter 3. Though structure and fundamentality are technically distinct, we will often use the two interchangeably, as does Sider. A description of what the world is fundamentally like uses all and only those concepts minimally necessary for a descriptively adequate and explanatory characterization. These are the structural, most perfectly "joint-carving" concepts. Crucially, structure on Sider's account is a sub-sentential operator that attaches to terms and other logical operators. A well-formed sentence that contains only structural terms and operators is itself structural. Conjoin all the true structural sentences and we have our Book of the World.

The Book of the World is not the world; it describes it. But since it describes the world accurately -- better than any rival depiction -- the concepts it deploys capture something objective about the world: "Structure is a worldly, not conceptual or linguistic, matter" (5 n.5) -- and in particular, "quantificational structure is part of the objective structure of the world" (188). Structure's worldliness may take some getting used to. The emphasis in metaphysics since Quine has been on ontology, on what exists, but "judgments about structure concern ideology, not ontology" (94). Insofar as we believe that a privileged true theory of the world (not merely a true inventory) is achievable in principle, we will have to accept that fundamental ideology reflects something objective about the world, just not some things. Such is the fundamental brief of Sider's book.

On Sider's austere vision, described in a brief final chapter, ontology is exhausted by spatiotemporal points and sets, while the ideology needed to adequately describe it includes the basic concepts of (whatever turns out to be) the true basic physics and the formal machinery of first-order logic with identity and set membership on which such a physical theory will likely depend. Sider argues that it should also include structure itself (lest metaphysics should lose its substantivity).

Sider does not take the (epistemically difficult) position of declaring ordinary claims that have not been metaphysically sanitized to be one and all false. Ordinary truths are indeed true, they are just not fundamentally true. What is the relationship between the two kinds of truths? Following many others, Sider says that the ordinary truths hold in virtue of the fundamental ones. He adds to this idea the explicit constraints that structure is complete -- "every non-fundamental truth holds in virtue of some fundamental truth" (105) -- and pure -- "fundamental truths involve only fundamental notions" (106).

Given these two features, in order to show the relation between fundamental and non-fundamental truths, we need to provide what Sider calls a "metaphysical semantics" for the non-fundamental truths. Metaphysical semantics works as follows: take your preferred semantic model for a given non-fundamental domain (truth-theoretic, Montague-semantics, or whatever) and apply it to a sentence in ordinary English. However, only choose structural concepts for the semantic values you wish to assign. (We cannot do this in practice, of course, but Sider optimistically supposes that we can get a rough sense of how it would go for particular cases.) While it is clear that someone who engages in metaphysical semantics is trying to explain something, Sider is vague on exactly what this is. According to him, the scope of explanation for the metaphysical semanticist is narrower than that of present day linguists. She is not concerned to ensure that her semantics accounts for speakers' knowledge or psychological facts. Instead, she is concerned to explain "how what we say fits into fundamental reality" (112). But what this means is not clear; perhaps what it means is to explain what it is for a sentence cast in non-structural terms to be true.

Sider's structuralist picture has affinities to Kit Fine's (2001) grounding and Jonathan Schaffer's (2009) fundamentality (which Sider dubs "entity grounding") accounts, and he provides a clear and illuminating discussion of the relationship among the views. Though the 'in virtue of' relation is important for all three thinkers, the main difference Sider finds between his view and those of his "friendly rivals" lies in what each takes to be the objects of fundamentality. Schaffer says individual objects are appropriately called "fundamental"; Fine takes propositions to be at the bottom rung of being. Sider describes his approach as "sub-propositional" and as sharing certain affinities with Fine's view. We find this description to be a bit modest in two respects. First, Sider's emphasis on fundamentality's tie to ideology is something not really found in other works on fundamentality, including Schaffer's and Fine's. In a certain sense, Sider's position is not best described as "sub-propositional." Rather, it should be "sub-sentential." He is not really interested in the innards of propositions; his main concern is the tools used to express propositions and their constituents. Secondly, the 'in virtue of' relation features much less prominently in Sider's view than it does in either Fine's or Schaffer's. He also discusses what a truthmaking theory of fundamentality might look like, though this seems forced, as truthmaking theories are not intended as accounts of fundamentality.

Having made a case for his favored theory in the company of realist rivals, Sider then delves into varieties of ontological deflationism. Despite all his robust realists tendencies, he is a careful and honest expositor of rival theories. An excellent case in point is his lengthy discussion of quantifier variance. Sider makes a host of novel and interesting criticisms, too many to address here. Most of the criticisms are focused on how the quantifier variantist can play the game of fundamentality. However, Eli Hirsch (the arch-quantifier variantist) has not really attempted to play this game (the closest attempt comes in some of his discussions of naturalness in his 1993 book, Dividing Reality), so Sider has double duty here. He sensitively raises not only the question, but also some potential responses on behalf of the quantifier variantists, some of which may be worth further development, despite his misgivings.

Sider's book is very rich. But it is not without tensions and implausibilities, and so we turn now in a more critical direction.

One of the ontologically realist views Sider discusses and criticizes is 'Tractarianism', in which the fundamental facts concern individuals, rather than being quantified (203). We think his discussion provides a convenient context to probe the basis of his commitment to "worldly" quantificational structure. Sider begins by noting a modal reason for thinking that Tractarianism cannot adequately account for (non-fundamental) quantificational truths. The Tractarian metaphysical truth condition for the sentence ∃xFx is (presumably) a disjunction of the form Fa1 v Fa2 v . . . . However, this fails to provide a modal equivalence, since there might have been an Fb, distinct from any of the Fais. As he notes, this objection will not appear decisive to a deflationist about modality, such as Sider himself.

Rather than provide another, more decisive direct objection to Tractarianism, he shifts to considering what reasons there might be for embracing it, and argues that they are unconvincing. He allows that "there is an admittedly powerful intuition that, for example, the general fact that ∃xFx holds because of the individualistic fact that Fa" (204-5). If this is construed (as Sider thinks it best is) as the claim that a theory of reality that omits generalizations is more explanatory, he objects that it flies in the face of our generally preferring quantified explanations to purely individualistic ones (205).

We see a tension here with Sider's Humeanism. On the one hand, Sider endorses the idea that true generalizations can explain individual facts they subsume. It is this thought that is supposed to underwrite our accepting 'quantificational structure' as a basic feature of reality. On the other hand, the Humean maintains that individual facts are metaphysically prior to and fix the generalizations. Thus, notions connected to that of natural law are not part of the world's fundamental structure. It can easily look like Sider is trying to have things both ways when it comes to the question of the relative (metaphysical) priority of individual facts and generalizations. We take it that, for Sider, a mixture of explanatory and purely metaphysical considerations determines what we should count as structural. But we don't believe that he has fully explained why this is appropriate. (Perhaps certain elements of what Sider includes in the Book of the World are better located in an Interpreter's Guide supplementary volume?)

There may be a related tension, though the matter is murkier, in Sider's discussion of 'Melianism' (137-40), on which structure is not itself a basic structural concept. Sider's basic objection to this view turns on a similar point to the one made in response to Tractarianism: the structurality of structure has explanatory power. There are illuminating generalizations across both purely metaphysical notions and those of physics (involving the purely natural properties). There is no hope for defining structurality in other terms, so absent this commitment to the primitive structurality of structure, there will be no 'unity' to the class of structural notions, and this is somehow contra our explanatory commitments. Is there a metaphysical priority relation between structure's structurality and that of, say, the quantifiers? Does how we answer this question affect the plausibility of Sider's claim regarding explanatory power? We are uncertain how to answer these questions, but they seem to us to merit further discussion.

Sider follows Quine and Lewis in giving very high value to parsimony in one's basic ontology and ideology and thereby tentatively endorses an austere vision of reality. Repeatedly, he considers and rejects plausible candidates for structurality solely on grounds of parsimony: causation (72-4), natural lawhood (22), logical truth and consequence (223), metaphysical modality (267), and mereological composition (292).

As with Quine and Lewis, one may easily doubt that Sider has sufficient resources (fundamental entities and concepts -- structure) to make good reflective sense of our epistemological successes. Unlike the actual Hume, Sider is much too cheerful a generalized metaphysical Humean to ponder much the epistemic justification of our epistemic practices, including those of foundational science and mathematics, shorn of commitments to the structurality of basic epistemic norms and logical consequence, let alone ground-level causation and/or laws of nature and other forms of metaphysical modality.

Set this deep reservation aside. One still might wonder why, if explanatory considerations on some level do drive our structural commitments, notions that prove necessary for us to fully explicate the explanatory structural notions that we employ should not thereby count as structural as well. We haven't space to explore this matter, but the reader might consult Sider's discussions of the status of logical consequence (272-4) and of second-order quantification (214-5).

But parsimony and explanatory considerations do not expose the entire domain of the fundamental. Consider which logical operators belong in the Book of the World (217-222). The trouble is that it is natural to impose a non-redundancy constraint on ideological elements. But given the truth-functional equivalency between the combination of conjunction and negation and that of disjunction and negation (not to mention the Sheffer Stroke!), it looks like we must choose only one pair of operators. Sider, instead, suggests that we reject the non-redundancy constraint and advocates for a 'logical pluralism.' We should welcome all logical operators into the fundamental language (a language which contains all and only fundamental expressions) and replace the non-redundancy constraint with a similar constraint on reasonable belief. But the rejection of the non-redundancy constraint and endorsement of a modest form of logical pluralism raises interesting questions about how the Book of the World should be written. Depending on how far the non-redundancy constraint on reasonable belief goes, what are we to do with multiple equivalent operators, predicates, and quantifiers? A natural idea might be to write multiple books, none of which contain any redundancies borne from, e.g., equivalent operators. Sider, however, always talks of the Book of the World and never entertains the notion that there may be more than one. The role that redundant sets of operators play in such a book is unclear. Could the idea be that, according to logical pluralism, since all the logical operators of classical logic are equally structural, they must all play some distinctive role in the Book of the World? Does a would-be author of the Book make a mistake if she forgets to add in the Sheffer Stroke? We would like to see Sider clarify what we are to do with equally structural, but equivalent notions.

The final lines of Sider's closing chapter ("A Worldview") are: "I have imagined one way the book of the world might be. It is not a tale of common sense. But we can, I think, recognize it as our own" (296). Speaking for ourselves, we do not at all recognize our world in Sider's stark account: fundamentally a collection of structured spacetime points and sets, accompanied by basic physical predicates and a bit of formal machinery. This is a profoundly anti-humanist vision, in which personhood and value don't merit a mention in the fundamental world book, having no place in the objective deep structure of things. Sider is hardly alone among contemporary metaphysicians in embracing this sort of radical reductionism, but we conclude only that they need to get out more.

While we don't much care for Sider's preferred telling of the Book of the World, his Writing the Book of the World, by contrast, is a terrific achievement: profound, rigorously systematic, and full of clarifying insights and arguments.


Fine, Kit (2001). "The Question of Realism," Philosophers' Imprint 1 (2): 1-30.

Hirsch, Eli (1993). Dividing Reality. Oxford University Press.

Schaffer, Jonathan (2009). "On What Grounds What," in David Manley, David J. Chalmers, and Ryan Wasserman (eds.), Metametaphysics. Oxford University Press.