In this interesting and provocative book, Kukla and Lance (K&L) challenge two fundamental assumptions of 20th century philosophy:
1. that semantics of language is relevant to fundamental philosophical issues, and
2. that declarative assertion is the paradigmatic instance of linguistic acts.
These entail that language is a vehicle for reporting how things are; consequently, little can be gained by studying language’s social functions, including its role in changing the world and our places in it. Semantics is the central element of language, with pragmatics a poor second, illuminating little beyond the social or cultural habits of language users, which are contingent upon understanding language.
K&L propose deposing semantics from this privileged place in favor of pragmatics. Only by studying the pragmatic features of speech acts can we hope to make good on the promise of the “linguistic turn” to clarify and, on occasion, answer the most fundamental questions in epistemology, metaphysics, moral theory, philosophy of science, and philosophy of language itself.
Their approach puts language at the heart of human interactions: language is a social construct dependent upon normative standing — whether individual or general — which we use to alter our positions relative to one another and to the world.
Declarative assertion certainly has this effect; however, the importance of normativity isn’t fully clear until we look beyond declarative assertion. Consider how declarative assertions alter our normative standing. Suppose something, f, is the case, but no one knows it. All of us suffer a defect in our knowledge, but that amounts simply to a failure to be omniscient. However, once someone asserts that f is so, this changes. Once “we” — the speech community — know f, it enters the public arena of the discursive community. Even though many, perhaps most, of us do not know f, our failing is no longer simply that of not being omniscient. Through declaration, the reasons supporting some assertion — for example, the nature of muons, the reasons diet affects cholesterol levels, and the molecular structure of ascorbic acid — become part of the materials linguistically available to the speech community. As a result, we are all in a position to make assertions concerning them.1
Declaratives have this effect because their input and output conditions are general and neutral; this contributes to a tendency to ignore the role of pragmatics of declarative assertion. If, however, we look at other speech acts, it becomes clear that input and output conditions — a part of pragmatics, not semantics or syntax
- are the key to understanding how they function. Input conditions concern the speaker; output conditions, the audience.
There are four possibilities:
1. Neutral input and neutral output
2. Relative input and neutral output
3. Neutral input and relative output
4. Relative input and relative output.
Declaratives fall into the first category; baptisms the second; prescriptives the third; and imperatives, promises, invitations, and reproaches the fourth. None of the categories has logical priority over the others. Here are some examples of members of categories 2 – 4:
1. Second: Baptisms have agent relative input (I must be an appropriately designated person in order to baptize something), but once the baptism occurs, everyone in the speech community is responsible for the resultant name; it’s part of the language of the discursive community. The Empire State Building is not so-called just for New Yorkers or Americans but for everyone, full stop.
2. Third: Anyone can call upon you to do your duty because it is your duty, but it is only your duty, it isn’t anyone else’s. Thus, “ought claims” are input neutral and output relative.
3. Fourth: Consider a law prohibiting the consumption of alcohol on public transport. To make this law, the “speaker” must be in an appropriate position; thus the input is agent relative. Laws are general, but their output is relative: e.g., only those satisfying the predicate “is a passenger on public transport” are affected. Today I may not do so, but tomorrow when I get on the tube to go to Heathrow, I will.
This brief, and incomplete, look at K&L’s analysis gives some indication of the potential of their approach. Putnam’s well-known case of Oscar and his “water” might be better explained in terms of this model than in terms of the linguistic division of labor and the relative positioning of “experts” vis-à-vis the rest of us. Kripke’s baptismal account of names could be detached from the metaphysical claims he appeals to in Naming and Necessity. The reason Richard Feynman is Richard Feynman isn’t some mysterious causal connection between the name and the man; it’s entirely due to his parents (input-relative) putting the name into the speech community through an output-neutral speech act.
Why call the book ‘Yo!’ and ‘Lo!’? So far it seems to be little more than an elaboration, albeit an interesting one, of the analysis of speech acts begun by J. L. Austin. It is, however, their most innovative thesis that gives rise to the title: K&L argue that every speech act rests upon our ability to call attention to our own recognition of some state of affairs, and to recognize states of affairs.
In distinctively different ways, our abilities to perform Lo-utterance and Yo-utterances are transcendental conditions upon the possibility of speaking a language with which we communicate with one another about a shared objective world (41).
Yo! and Lo!-acts fit in both categories 2 and 4
- they are observatives, serving the dual function of observing and ostending. This gives them a special place in language conceived as “a concrete embodied social practice whose purpose is meaningful communication” (1).
K&L’s arguments are original and fecund. They are also deeply frustrating. The proposed topography of speech acts, seen as part of the “space of reasons”, is interesting, and helps the reader to understand why and how language is an essential part of our reasoning, conceptualizing, producing knowledge, finding truth (and falsity), making claims on one another, and affecting the world we inhabit. K&L add to the understanding of language and its place in human life, and they provoke the attentive reader to consider issues from new perspectives. All of this makes for good philosophical reading that is at times challenging but generally worth the effort.
At the same time, however, there are aspects of their arguments and assumptions which some readers will find not only wrong-headed, but identical at base with the deepest assumption of 20th century philosophy of language: viz., that language is ultimately grounded not in practices, but in the world. In short, they assume that the world is divided into conceptually differentiated units, and that our task is to enshrine these units in language, just as Plato’s good butcher aims to carve the animal at its joints rather than hacking it willy-nilly. Many readers will be disappointed at the slight attention paid to H. P. Grice, Wittgenstein and J. L. Austin, all of whom laid the groundwork for understanding language as a social phenomenon that cannot be teased apart from our lived lives in a shared world. This oversight leads K&L astray at several points in connection with their central contention: that we can account for objectivity and truth under a social conception of language. Finally, some readers will be disappointed by the complete absence of any discussion of Noam Chomsky, who offers what is perhaps the deepest challenge to K&L’s arguments. I, for one, would very much like to have seen them develop an argument against the Chomskyan approach based on their analysis and use of observatives.
The most significant of my concerns is that K&L fail to make the case that we can account for objectivity and truth under a social conception of language. In what follows, I give the briefest indication of some problems with their attempt to do this. In a short review like this, it is impossible actually to present a complete critique of their position, but I hope that what I say here will encourage others to pick up ‘Yo!’ and ‘Lo!’, and think about the arguments for themselves.
“Spinning in the void”
K&L take it that the problem they must solve is how we manage to give reasons for our beliefs without always appealing to other beliefs. This is the problem McDowell takes on in Mind and World, and K&L set themselves the task of finding a way to make something like McDowell’s solution (naturalized Kantianism) work. They see McDowell as being on the right track, but in the end failing to answer the question of how we can avoid “spinning in the void” without committing ourselves to The Myth of the Given.
Once we cease to presuppose that everything that has any conceptual structure has the form of a declarative … we open new room for making an account like McDowell’s satisfying. If we understand observations as having the pragmatic structure given expression in observatives, then we can hold on to several key results at once. Observatives directly express our receptive contact with the world, and yet they are thoroughly embedded within the rational, discursive, inferential structure of the space of reasons. Hence they can provide reasons for belief without being beliefs … To observe is not just to inherit entitlement to a belief, but rather to recognize how things show up to me. I recognize what I see with my concepts, and hence such recognitions already bear articulate rational relations to the rest of the space of reasons, including beliefs (73-74).
At first blush, this sounds promising. For me to observe, I have to do more than merely “perceive”, I actually have to take things in, they must "show up to me". Prior to this “showing up”, the passing scene doesn’t offer me anything to work with; there is literally nothing for me to say, and hence nothing that might provide reasons for my beliefs.
The problem for traditional accounts is that this “showing up” can only be understood in terms of declarative assertions, and we are all too aware of the difficulties here. The most significant of these is that such an account requires the world in itself to be conceptually differentiated and, thus, assertoric. If, however, we hold that the “showing up” gains its linguistic expression in observatives and recognitives (Yo! and Lo!-acts), we appeal to speech acts that are not tainted with conceptual content in the same way that declarative assertions are. Observation gives us an entry point into language and the space of reasons that does not require linguistic/conceptual justification.
Is this too good to be true? Well, yes. The passage continues: “My observation has the form ‘A rabbit!’, which is not grounded in but rather entails beliefs such as ‘There is a rabbit present’” (74). On the one hand, K&L hold that the observative, (1) ‘A rabbit!’, is not grounded in the belief, (2) ‘There is a rabbit present’, thus escaping the charge that we are caught in a web of language. On the other hand, they see no problem in holding that (1) can function in an argument; it can serve as the reason supporting (2), which requires that (1) have whatever features are necessary for a speech act to function in an argument.
This leaves K&L in the very position they are trying to escape: in order to avoid a charge of language based relativism, we must find a way of entering language at the propositional level necessary to support beliefs which does not itself depend on propositions (beliefs). They offer no account of how observatives both do this and are sufficiently conceptually robust to function as evidence for propositionally expressed beliefs (declarative assertions). This is crucial. If observatives can’t serve as reasons, then we will be left spinning in the void — and a solipsistic void at that.
Key to this is how we move from merely sensing the world to having it presented to us, the move that Quine so effectively argues cannot be explained without “acquiescing in our mother tongue”, along with all the conceptual and ontic differentiations enshrined there. Quine’s arguments show that the line of argument K&L pursue always ends badly: either observatives are not conceptually charged, in which case they can’t function as reasons, or they are, but the view now falls to Quine’s charge of petitio.
There is one possible escape route. If K&L could show that there is only one discursive community to which all humans belong, they could avoid solipsism and make a good case that it doesn’t much matter that languages are “games” we invent. If we all, of some natural necessity, invent the same language game, then the sort of naturalized Kantian moves in McDowell, supplemented with K&L’s insight about the centrality of observatives, might just be enough to show that linguistically we respond to the same world in the same way.
There are three possibilities.
1. There are multiple discursive communities, separated by divisions which preclude members of one community from entering “into relationships of mutual recognition with members of other communities” (196).
2. There is one discursive community, though there are differences at the margins: “All agent-neutral inputs and outputs have exactly the same, completely universal scope”. The boundaries of the community are not sharply defined, and “full participation in this community … is a regulative ideal which agents will rarely if ever meet”, but like "the space of reasons and norms this community negotiates" the community is “essentially unitary” (196).
3. There is one fundamental discursive community — an Ur-community — which allows us to “recognize our common personhood and refer to a single objective world” despite and across the boundaries of our specific language communities (196).
1 is a non-starter. Why do K&L favor 2 over 3? It’s really not clear; 2 strengthens the claim that their analysis avoids relativism, but why prefer it? After considering various examples which seem to favor 3, they conclude that
[u]ltimately, we are not compelled enough by such possible recherché counterexamples, at this point, to be convinced that adding discursive subcommunities to our ontology is worth the complications. We thus suggest, tentatively, that there is really only one discursive community — only one ‘we’ made up of rational, mutually recognizing agents who are sensitive to the claims of a public world (205).
This passage is odd in several respects, but I want to focus on the notion of sensitivity to “the claims of a public world”. What does this mean, and how do we judge it? If Quine’s arguments go through, then any “community” can maintain that it consists of individuals who are “sensitive” to these “claims”, and the usefulness of their language is the proof of this. Consequently, the ontic posits of the community are “true” to the world.
K&L have no response. Despite their adherence to a social conception of language, they accept it as part of the terms of the debate that we must produce a mind-independent basis for objectivity and truth. Seen in this light, their failure to explain how observatives might do the job they set for them is the result of their simply “acquiescing in their mother tongue”.
There are other points in the book where this same sort of “acquiescence” comes through. For example, they associate objectivity with empirical claims, those claims “which can trace [their] warrant to or be invalidated by an observative”, and argue that this captures “the intuition that objective claims are responsive to experience” (84, 85). Since all of this is measured in our language, it’s difficult to see how someone who accepts modern biology can convince the believer in a new Earth theory that she is simply not being responsive to “experience”. The new-Earther will appeal to her beliefs and observatives as expressed in her language to counter this claim.
One explanation of the problem here can be found in K&L’s insistence that Wittgenstein is a relativist, which as I’ve hinted stems from the way in which they frame the entire discussion. An interpretation of Wittgenstein that treats him as an epistemic realist and ontic-relativist would give K&L access to a solution which makes more effective use of their social conception of language. In a review of this size, I can’t give an outline of what this alternative looks like, though I have argued it at length elsewhere.2 After a promising start, K&L do not take this path and remain firmly in the grips of epistemic relativism — or, to adopt a gentler, more Quinean tone, their home community.
These complaints are serious, but they shouldn’t put the reader off: the duty of philosophical discussion is to provoke questions, and never spare the reader “the trouble of thinking”; ‘Yo!’ and ‘Lo’ succeeds admirably on this measure.
1 K&L do not deny that the community affected by a speech act is time sensitive. My failure to recognize something that “we” know — e.g., the chemical composition of water — is different from that of an early Abyssinian. For her, not knowing that it’s H2O is a result of her not being omniscient, for me (and Oscar, one supposes) it’s more serious.