Categories We Live By: The Construction of Sex, Gender, Race, and Other Social Categories

Ásta, Categories We Live By: The Construction of Sex, Gender, Race, and Other Social Categories, Oxford University Press, 2018, 140pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190256807.

Reviewed by Åsa Burman, Stockholm University

Consider this scenario: you work as a coder in San Francisco. You go into your office where you are one of the guys. After work, you tag along with some friends at work to a bar. It is a very heteronormative space, and you are neither a guy nor a gal. You are an other. You walk up the street to another bar where you are a butch and expected to buy drinks for the femmes. Then you head home to your grandmother's eightieth birthday party, where you help out in the kitchen with the other women while the men smoke cigars. (73)

Recently, I was discussing Ásta's book with a fellow social ontologist who exclaimed, "I not only think her view is elegant but also believe it is correct!" I agree with the elegance of this work; the book is clearly and concisely written, and the new theory presented -- the conferralist framework -- promises to capture a large and crucial part of social reality with a few basic elements. It accounts for both communal properties (being cool, being a popular footballer) and institutional properties (being a professor, being a surgeon general). It is a key contender for being the correct view of the social world. However, I am not fully convinced that it is the correct account, for two reasons. First, the key notions of "behavioral constraints" and "behavioral enablements" are not sufficiently developed with respect to communal properties, and we need further clarification to fully evaluate the conferralist account. Second, the conferralist framework cannot account for all social categories (e.g., the opaque dimensions of class) despite its claim to the contrary. Before elaborating on these objections, I provide a summary of Ásta's main claims and what I take to be her key contributions.

The book is a significant contribution to metaphysics and social theory. First, it offers a new theory of social categories.[1] In doing so, it also provides a general and systematic alternative to influential theories in social ontology, which Ásta labels "constitution accounts." Her examples include John Searle's theories of social reality (1995, 2010), Elizabeth Barnes's theory of disability (2016), and Charles Mills's theory of race (1998). Second, it assigns appropriate weight to a different type of paradigmatic social phenomena -- the communal -- and promises to account for both institutional and communal properties. In fact, Ásta claims that: "The conferralist framework can be used to make sense of any social category" (4).

Third, she offers an explicit and fresh stance on methodological questions with her choice of examples. Consider the coder example in the epigraph: not only does it point to the centrality of communal properties that enable or restricts one's behavior, but also represents a complex, real-world example. Ásta's choice of examples and her emphasis on communal properties are in line with her normative commitment to offer a theory that can aid in fighting social injustices and oppression. This contrasts with theories in traditional social ontology that seek to "describe social reality in an entirely value-neutral way, unhindered by any political commitments" (6).

We turn now to the general conferralist framework and, first, of what it is for a property P to be institutional (21):

Conferred property: P

Who: a person or entity or group in authority

What: their explicit conferral by means of a speech act or other public act

When: under the appropriate circumstances (in the presence of witnesses, at a particular place, etc.); we can think of this as a particular institutional context

Base property: the property or properties the authorities are attempting to track in the conferral

and, second, of what it is for a property P to be communal (22):

Conferred property: P

Who: a person or entity or group with standing

What: their conferral, explicit or implicit, by means of attitudes and behavior

When: in a particular context

Base property: the property or properties the authorities [sic] are attempting to track in the conferral, consciously or unconsciously[2]

One implication of this framework is that you have social properties in virtue of other people's beliefs about you; another is that it is other people's perception that matters, rather than your actually having the base property. Ásta writes "it is the perception that the base property (or properties) is present that matters on the conferralist account, not the actual presence of it" (27). So, other people are trying to track a base property, and even if they are mistaken about your possessing this base property (you did not receive the majority of the electoral college votes), you would still have the conferred property (becoming the president of the US). Furthermore, social properties -- especially communal ones -- are highly dependent on context. To illustrate, consider the communal property of being cool (22-23):

Conferred property: being cool

Who: the people in the context, collectively

What: their judging the person to have the base property or properties

When: in a particular context the person travels in: for example, one context can be at Mission High School in San Francisco, another the skate park in the Sunset District of San Francisco; someone can be cool at Mission High, but not at the skate park

Base property: the property or properties the conferrers are attempting to track in their conferral in each contexts; for example, having blue hair may be a base property for being cool at Mission High; having a tattoo at the skate park

There is a further central element to Ásta's account: constraints and enablements. Social properties are social statuses and are essentially tied to what you can and cannot do in a social context in the sense that "a social property, whether institutional or communal, is fleshed out in terms of the constraints and enablements, institutional or communal, on a person's behavior and action. To have the status in question just is to have the constraints and enablements in question" (29). So, all social properties are constraints and enablements.[3]

This general framework should be distinguished from its specific applications to sex, gender, race, and disability. One such application is the view that there still are institutional (as well as communal) racial categories in the United States. One's race, despite common assumptions, is not about self-identification[4] or about genetics; rather, it is conferred by authorities in the institutional case and by others with standing in the communal case. For example, race is conferred by the authorities on one's birth certificate in some US states and data about people's race, say people living in a particular neighborhood, is sometimes used in determining the governmental allocation of resources for that neighborhood. In the communal case, on the other hand, it might be one's peers with standing who confer one's race in a particular context.

Another specific proposal is that both sex and gender are social categories, in contrast to the view that sex is biological and gender social (73). Ásta positions her view in relation to other influential accounts (e.g., those of Beauvoir, Sally Haslanger, and Judith Butler); her interpretation of this debate is illuminating. She also argues that "gender is radically context dependent" in the communal case (ibid.), which the coder example illustrates.[5] This context-dependence is a feature of communal properties (cf. being cool). Ásta also argues that being disabled is a conferred property. In the last chapter, her discussion shifts from the conferrers to ourselves, specifically how social categories shape our self-understanding or identity.

We turn now to the two objections that are directed at the general conferralist framework.

Recall that "the constraints on and enablements to a person's behavior and action" are an essential part of conferralism since social properties are defined in terms of them. But what are these constraints and enablements? Institutional properties are understood in terms of institutional rights and institutional obligations, hence are deontic in a narrow sense.[6] This is in line with ideas familiar from traditional social ontology where institutional rights are referred to as "positive deontic powers" and institutional obligations as "negative deontic powers". But there is little explanation of what the communal constraints and enablements actually are, beyond the claim that they are non-institutional powers (20-21, 33) that are not deontic (106). What kind of powers, then, are they? Since the purpose of the book is to account for communal properties defined in terms of constraints and enablements, the role of these non-institutional and non-deontic powers is central to the account, making it crucial to obtain a deeper understanding of them. Ásta's bully example provides greater clarity about these non-deontic constraints and enablements (18-19):

Billy the bully sees that Max's grandmother has given him the special candy from Austria, and says to Max, "Give me your candy!" Big-Tom, Big-Dick, and Big-Harry, Billy's posses [sic], stand beside him, menacing. Max loves his Mozartkugeln and doesn't want to give Billy the candy, but he doesn't want to get the "toilet treatment" again. Although Billy does not have the authority to order Max to give him the candy, he has power over Max and can make his life miserable. This power is what enables Billy to order Max to give him the candy, even though he has no institutional authority over him. In this case, Billy's power over Max has its source in Max's fear of the things Billy could do to him. Billy, then, has enough standing with Max to be able to order him to give him the candy.

I think there are two different ways -- one deontic and one physical -- to explain the constraints and enablements in this example. Either Billy has an informal right due to his status as the school bully and Max is under an informal obligation to give him the candy (and there are informal rights and obligations within the group of bullies), or this is a matter of (the threat of) physical force, analogous to a robber pointing a gun and "asking for" money. The group of bullies can easily outnumber Max, and Billy's social status is not needed to explain why Max hands over the candy. So, this case can be explained by deontic notions, physical force, or a combination of both. According to the conferralist framework, however, the behavioral constraints and enablements cannot be deontic since being a bully is a communal rather than an institutional property. It cannot only be about physical force either, since the example is about communal, not physical, reality. In short, these behavioral constraints and enablements are neither institutional nor about physical force in the conferralist framework. In what, then, does this category of non-institutional, non-deontic, and not purely physical power, consist?

Consider the coder in San Francisco who is expected to buy drinks for the femmes. This sounds like a deontic notion, but in this example, gender is a communal property; thus this constraint cannot be deontic on Ásta's account. So, we need an explanation of the "communal constraints on and enablements to a person's behavior and action" to fully evaluate the correctness of the conferralist framework.[7]

We turn now to the objection that the conferralist framework cannot account for all social categories. One of the book's main contributions is to offer a general account of social categories guided by normative commitment: a theory that can aid in fighting social injustices and oppression.

Throughout the book, Ásta applies the conferralist framework to categories like sex, gender, race, disability, sexual orientation, and religion, all of which show (evidence of) a base property that either is or is taken to be transparent to the conferrers, for example on the body, in manners, or in speech. In each case, the conferrers attempt to track something they can observe. There are other social categories, like class, that also involve constraints and enablements but are discussed only in a few short passages.

The conferralist analysis can easily be extended to certain aspects of class. Ásta offers the historical example of a group of people with standing referring to the use of cloth napkins instead of paper napkins and the use of certain words and not others as upper class and hence conferring this property on some people (the Sloane Square example). Here again, there is a transparent feature that is taken as (evidence of) the base property of being upper class. But there are other aspects of class that work in other ways. Consider class as one's relation to the means of production. This category is different from the other social categories considered so far: these constraints and enablements are not due to the perceptions of the conferrers but rather to one's place in the capitalist system. For example, one's income and wealth significantly impact a wide range of things, ranging from mental and physical health to educational and career opportunities.

We can call the Sloane Square example "social class" and the latter notion "economic class." The first can be captured within the conferralist framework, but the second cannot. Still, economic class is a social property that impacts what one can and cannot do (i.e., it sets behavioral constraints and enablements), but it is not a conferred property. In fact, economic class cannot be a conferred property, since it is in conflict with the central tenets of the conferralist account: that the conferrers are attempting to track a base property, that their perception is essential to the conferral, and that the constraints and enablements are tied to a person's perceived social status. It might even be that class is an opaque kind of social fact to the conferrers. It would then be, due to its very opaqueness, in tension with the central idea of conferralism: that the perception of other people is essential for a social property to exist.[8] Still, economic class is a social property that significantly impacts one's life chances and a key component of social injustice and oppression. Thus, it is central to Ásta's project.

There are theoretical resources in the book, but not within the conferralist framework, to capture this case.[9] In the last chapter, "Identity as Social Location," a distinction between a person's subjective and objective identities is introduced: "Our objective social identity is simply our location on a social map that we occupy stably, with its associated norms of behavior. We can have an objective social identity without being aware that we do" (122). The latter can help us to account for social categories, which are opaque to both conferrers and subjects. But in order to capture the opacity of class we might thus need to introduce a hybrid theory that relies on both conferred properties and objective identity. This would result in a theory that is less simple but might more accurately capture our complex, messy social world.

This book is not only elegant and a joy to read; it also advances the field of social ontology by offering an alternative to constitution accounts and placing communal properties at the center of social reality. It is a must-read for anyone interested in social ontology and social theory.


Thanks to Ásta, Johan Brännmark, Maria Dunér, and Sally Haslanger for helpful discussions.


Barnes, Elizabeth, The Minority Body (2016), New York: Oxford University Press

Mills, Charles, Blackness Visible (1998), New York: Cornell University Press

Searle, John R., The Construction of Social Reality (1995) New York: The Free Press

Searle, John R., Making the Social World (2010), New York: Oxford University Press

Thomasson, Amie, "Foundations for a Social Ontology" ProtoSociology, (2003), 18-19, 269-290.

[1]Ásta uses "social category" and "social kind" interchangeably. On her account, women or queers are social categories or social kinds, while being a woman or being queer are social properties.

[2] Ásta clarifies that it should be "people with standing" here (personal communication).

[3] Ásta writes that "a social status just is the constraints and enablements conferred onto the bearer." (30). This contrasts with the constitution account where status functions imply, but are not identified with, institutional constraints and enablements. 

[4] Ásta provides a compelling argument for the view that self-identification is not the base property that the authorities are trying to track in the context of e.g. the Census. Rather, self-identification is evidence of the base property. The real base property in this context is geographical ancestry, which shows in that the authorities can revoke or change one's institutional racial status.

[5] Ásta offers an explanation of the controversy regarding the North Carolina Bathroom Bill using the conferralist framework. This case attests to the usefulness of the framework, e.g., by allowing for a variety of base properties, since different actors are trying to track different properties in this case. It also shows that one's gender can be an institutional property, not only a communal property.

[6] This narrow sense of "deontic" -- an institutional ought following from an institutional obligation -- is common in contemporary social ontology. It can be contrasted with the traditional and wider sense of "deontic" understood as what one ought to do (e.g., morally or as a matter of rationality) or what is the right thing to do (in a moral sense). On this narrow understanding of deontic, one's positive and negative deontic powers can be illegitimate, or morally wrong.

[7] Ásta suggests (in conversation) that communal statuses are frames of intelligibility for action. For example, a woman leader has the deontic power to issue orders but her communal status constrains this deontic power in the sense that all her orders are interpreted as requests, i.e., her status as a woman prevents her from issuing orders since it is unintelligible that a woman does this.

[8] See Thomasson (2003) for a discussion of "opaque kinds of social facts".

[9] Another option is to restrict the claim that this is an account of all social categories to the claim that it is an account of most social categories, or all socially salient categories. Ásta writes that "the main aim of the account I am offering is to account for socially salient categories and properties, phenomena that make a social difference" (108). In other words, the theory is meant to capture what it is for a feature of an individual to have social significance. One's economic class, if socially significant, would then be a conferred property. If one's economic class is not socially significant/salient, it would not be a social property on this view, but rather a material property, or relation which has social consequences. See Ásta's view of "social construction as social significance", and especially causal social construction which is relevant to this case (chapter 2).