A challenge all interpreters face is finding a language in which to mediate understanding between the author they are interpreting and a contemporary audience. Erich Auerbach accomplished this by recovering and expounding the idea and practice of figura, which became the basis for path-breaking interpretations of Dante. Similarly, many scholars have brought forward passages in Thomas Aquinas that Dante echoes or likely had in mind and used them to explain the poem's theological and philosophical grounding. Another example is the careful reconstruction of the cosmology of the Commedia, used to organize the entire structure of the Pardiso as well as for smaller functions like marking the passage of time or to convey a variety of other meanings. The advantage of such scholarly recoveries is that these are languages Dante himself spoke fluently. The disadvantage is that they may be so remote that they actually widen the distance of the contemporary reader from Dante. The more we understand Dante, the more we realize his thought presupposes ideas we may no longer believe and cannot share. One can try to relegate such erudition to footnotes where the ordinary reader can ignore it, but it is disconcerting to think that the more precisely one understands Dante, the more he seems so much of his time, the less he has to say to us.
The real core of this problem is translation. It is not enough to show that Dante echoes Aquinas. The question is what either or both mean -- and mean to us. How can we enter into Dante's thinking, not just as a historical curiosity but as still speaking compellingly to us? Francis J. Ambrosio tackles this problem from a different direction, taking Jacques Derrida "as a sort of Virgil to contemporary readers of the Commedia" (6). More precisely, to this end, he deploys a "thematically and chronologically … narrow cross-section" of Derrida's work (8), in particular a selection of the later texts in which Derrida reflected on religion. These include his engagement with Augustine in Circumfession (Derrida's part of the book Jacques Derrida, authored with Geoffrey Bennington and published in French in 1991); The Gift of Death (1992), which centers especially on the work of the Czech philosopher Jan Potočka and on Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling; the catalogue for an exhibition Derrida organized at the Louvre, Memoirs of the Blind: The Self-Portrait and Other Ruins (1990); and the lecture "To Forgive: The Unforgivable and the Imprescriptible" from Questioning God, edited by John Caputo et al. (2001). Derrida wrote much more about religion, but these texts are well chosen to resonate with Dante.
It is important to stress that Ambrosio is not "applying" Derrida to Dante in the manner of some interpreters who treat deconstruction as a shiny new sausage grinder they can run texts through to produce all-too-predictable results. On the contrary, his aim is "to engage the questions [Dante and Derrida] engage, which are primarily questions about faith, hope, and love, about responsibility, and about writing" (160). Derrida guides Ambrosio's reading of Dante, but Ambrosio is equally alert to how reading Dante helps us "read Derrida better" (132). He mediates a dialogue through which to probe deeply both writers' "shared commitment to forgiveness as the fundamental and universal concern of the religious dimension of personal existence" (11). Ambrosio gets us past reductive labels that block thinking, such as that Derrida is "atheist" and Dante "Christian." He concludes paradoxically: "Dante is no more Christian than Derrida; Derrida no less Christian than Dante" (224). Ambrosio says persuasively that both Derrida and Dante "testify to the necessity to save the name of God from every fixed determination" (225).
Not that Derrida and Dante just come to the same thing. Ambrosio accepts John Caputo's interpretation in The Prayers and Tears of Jacques Derrida (1993) that Derrida offers a "non-dogmatic" but "philosophical and metaphysical doublet" of the inner logic of "a history of responsibility" in Europe that opens the possibility of "religion without religion" (223). This philosophical doubling of religion parallels "a nondogmatic poetic doublet of Christian dogma" in Dante (223). And yet there is a difference. Ambrosio crystallizes this in a contrast between tears and smiles. For Derrida, "tears and not sight are the essence of the eye" (Memoirs of the Blind 126, cited Ambrosio 171) -- an arresting and compelling insight; but Dante, centering on the Christian doctrines of Incarnation and Resurrection, adds to the eye's tears the mouth's smile. The Purgatorio is soaked in Dante's tears, but the Paradiso moves to an astounding conclusion, as the eyes of Mary and of a smiling St. Bernard lead Dante into a vision of the Trinity centered on the resurrected body of Christ, a vision which exceeds the capacity of memory and language to record it but stirs again in the joy and love renewed as he writes.
Ambrosio's book is not easy reading. He recognizes he is making the "nearly impossible presumption" -- at least a very unlikely one -- that the reader will be as intimately familiar with Derrida's texts as he is himself. He scants clear exposition and explanation of Derrida's ideas, and some terms come clear only by good fortune when the reader comes across a sentence or phrase long after a term has been used over and over in rather perplexing ways -- and some terms never quite come clear. It's like learning a foreign language by the immersion method: words aren't really explained, they're just repeated until you get the impression you understand -- or give up trying. Derrida is irreducibly difficult, to be sure, and for good reason, but a reader shouldn't have to master the texts being commented on in order to understand the commentary. Ambrosio has also absorbed some of Derrida's tricks of style, sometimes with happy results, sometimes not. He falls into the tumbling rhetoric of deconstruction: "Death is the Impossibility of the Secret and the Secret of impossibility: the secret impossibility of the Gift, of all giving and taking, of Love, of Justice, and of course of Forgiveness, which is before the Gift, the Secret of the Gift" (214). This sort of rhetoric rolls through some very long sentences -- sentences over 100 words are common, the longest I noted running to 217 words. Such writing no doubt aims to wind the reader into a process of thinking while resisting the desire for reductive theses. At their best reading these sentences is like watching a master turn a Rubik's cube until it comes right. But it can also look like someone who can't make up his mind and tries to say everything in one breath. Generally, I think they do more harm than good. And there are minor but not negligible annoyances. The proof-reading is hopeless, and some typos could mislead an inexpert reader (the worst example is citing Charles Singleton as "John" in the "List of Abbreviation" [xv]; or to take one among several lesser examples, "Paolo" becomes "Paulo" for a few pages before recovering his correct spelling). There is no bibliography. The index is so short and selective that one suspects it is a satire aimed at readers who lazily rely on indexes to do their job for them. Many quotations lack citations. Superscript "4" occurs on p. 219, but no corresponding note on p. 237.
To these needless obstacles in the reader's path one must add a few errors or questionable ideas. The feeding of the multitudes does not take place at the Sermon on the Mount (108). Dante's immersion in the two rivers at the end of the Purgatorio is not a baptism (130, 177). If he hadn't already been baptized, he wouldn't be there at all. Not only the women stayed to witness Jesus' death on the Cross, but also "the disciple whom he loved" (175; see John 19:26), though admittedly the other disciples are nowhere to be found. The radical tendencies to sin are "dispositions" not "depositions" (133), unless this is an awkward way of saying sin is "deposited" in human beings. The White Rose in heaven may suggest a Rose Window (198), though I suspect the Gothic rose windows of Chartres, Notre Dame, or St. Denis go far beyond the occuli Dante would have seen in Italian churches. When Dante compares his bafflement at seeing Christ's resurrected body somehow incorporated into the Trinity, he compares it to the ancient puzzle of squaring the circle. The suggestion that this recalls the Vitruvian man Leonardo drew inscribed in both a square and circle is attractive (210), but I fear untenable, since Vitruvius' On Architecture was only rediscovered by Poggio Bracciolini in 1414, and I would need good reason to think Dante knew the work or a similar image. Dante's point here is different: even though one knows that there is a square of exactly the same area as a given circle, the human mind can see no way to construct it. I'm not persuaded by the Freudian logic that tries to connect the wolf in Inferno 1 to Beatrice (63). But none of these jeopardizes the book's main line of thought.
Ambrosio's venture of taking Derrida as his Virgil in reading Dante succeeds quite well. Ambrosio argues persuasively that Dante corrects himself, even repents for directing the wrong kind of love to Beatrice in the Vita Nuova, and learns to love her differently, as she reveals herself differently, now no longer alive but dead, and yet not dead but eternally alive. He presents insightful readings of the stories of Francesca and Paolo and of Ugolino, the episodes that begin and end Dante's journey to the uttermost depths of evil. The concept of "forgiveness" anchors a rewarding discussion of the Purgatorio, especially Dante's coming face to face at last with Beatrice. And some luminous pages on several later cantos of the Paradiso help a reader see how Dante the pilgrim in joining the community of saints takes the faith of the Resurrection as his own, so that he can proceed in his journey even after Beatrice returns to her place in heaven. The religious insights Ambrosio uncovers in Dante are thoroughly orthodox but take on a fresh and revealing depth. With the stimulus of Derrida's difficult and scrupulous reflection on fundamental themes of a religious interpretation of human existence -- themes like freedom, responsibility, gift, forgiving, death, love, belief, sacrifice, faith, and so on -- Ambrosio leads us to a Dante who is a profound religious thinker and not just mouthing received formulas. The religious insights of Ambrosio's Dante (and Derrida!) pierce deeply into human existence in a way that cannot be dismissed by the patronizing smugness of unthinking atheists nor demeaned by the reductive dogmas of unthinking believers. Thanks to Derrida, Ambrosio confirms again what a profound intellectual, even philosophical, challenge Christianity still offers readers of this great poet and thinker.