In putting together The Oxford Handbook of Contemporary Phenomenology (OHCP), Dan Zahavi has done a truly marvelous job. He has amassed essays of outstanding quality, replete with fascinating ideas, imaginative examples, and above all, carefully constructed arguments. There are critical and insightful phenomenological analyses of topics that run the gamut: from art, religion, and history; to the nature of perception, embodiment, and consciousness; to epistemological foundationalism and the problem of other minds; to methodological issues that phenomenology faces; to forgiveness, ethics, and shame; to the nature of self and self-consciousness; to sex and gender; and to the relationship between science and phenomenology. Still, what's most impressive is the fact that most of the essays could have been published in their present form in journals. This speaks highly not only of the quality and rigor of the contributions, but also of the book's timeliness. OHCP is a state-of-the art presentation of research conducted in, through, or inspired by, phenomenology. Given the breadth of the issues examined in it, the clarity of presentation, and the strength of argumentation, the volume is a remarkable achievement.
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In addition to Zahavi's brief editorial introduction, OHCP comprises twenty-eight essays grouped into seven sections. Regrettably, length restrictions limit my discussion to a subset of the volume's entries.
The volume starts defensively. In "Phenomenological Method: Reflection, Introspection, and Skepticism," David Cerbone responds to objections against the efficacy, reliability, and even coherence of phenomenology. Phenomenology, such objections hold, relies on introspection, but "introspection is an inherently problematic means for gathering data" (p. 8). Cerbone responds not by demonstrating the reliability of introspection but by distinguishing phenomenology from introspection and emphasizing phenomenology's interest in discovering essences and not in "cataloging the particularities of our actual, empirical psychological lives" (ibid.). In this way, he draws a distinction between descriptive psychology and phenomenology and argues that whatever issues arise due to the purported inadequacy and unreliability of introspection may affect the former but not the latter.
In "Transcendental Phenomenology and the Seductions of Naturalism: Subjectivity, Consciousness, and Meaning," Steven Crowell aims to resolve a paradox that arises within Husserl's transcendental phenomenology. Husserl's transcendental project must explicate the relationship between subject and world in a way that incorporates and makes sense of two claims that appear, prima facie at least, contradictory: (i) the subject is an entity in the world; and (ii) the subject is the ultimate source of meaning of the world. According to Crowell, a resolution of this paradox requires us to turn to the notion of person. The transcendental subject is the person -- understood essentially as embodied and practical -- and transcendental constitution should be modeled on action. To wit, what gives meaning to my surrounding world are my actions. I don't take the world (including myself) to be a certain way and then act. Meaning arises as I act (see, e.g., p.37). Importantly, no antecedent action or intention is needed in order to give meaning to my action. Action is self-constituting. Or so Crowell holds.
In Charles Siewert's "Respecting Appearances: A Phenomenological Approach to Consciousness," the lines between analytic philosophy of mind and phenomenology are not only blurred but altogether erased. The essay is a wonderfully written investigation into the nature of consciousness. Its aim is to clarify concepts, ideas, and notions that are operative in philosophical discussions of consciousness. Siewert's contribution can be divided into two parts. In the first (pp. 52-8), he presents three different but complementary ways of articulating the notion of phenomenal consciousness. In the second (pp. 58-68), he teases out the consequences of his proposal. Siewert argues that "underived and critical use of first-person reflection" (p.50) shows that phenomenal experiences are intentional (pp. 58-60), contentful (p.61), and representational insofar as they have accuracy conditions (pp. 61-62). He also holds that critical use of first-person reflection speaks against the idea that "we can generally isolate some layer of 'non-conceptual content' and restrict sense experience entirely to this" (p. 67).
Can phenomenology be naturalized? And if so, how? In his excellent contribution, "On the Possibility of Naturalizing Phenomenology," Shaun Gallagher provides answers to both of those questions. To many the very idea of a naturalized phenomenology appears oxymoronic: any attempt to naturalize phenomenology is bound to transform phenomenology into something that it is not. The conflict between phenomenology and naturalism becomes manifest once the transcendental dimension of phenomenology is pointed out. The phenomenological subject isn't the real, empirical, or psychological subject; it isn't the subject of natural sciences; nor is it an object or entity in the world like many others. The phenomenological subject is instead a transcendental subject. This subject is revealed by the epoché not as a spatiotemporal entity but instead as absolute, as existing for itself, prior to and constituting worldly entities (see Husserl 1971, pp. 145-6; Husserl 1973, p. 118; cf. Husserl 1977, p. 92 and p. 96).
Gallagher offers a way out of this conflict. He suggests that we can meaningfully engage in a project of naturalizing phenomenology, if phenomenology is understood as phenomenological psychology, i.e., as the critical and reflective investigation of the intentional character and structures of consciousness from the first-person perspective. This type of reflective investigation, Gallagher points out, can be performed while remaining in the natural attitude. And although this way of doing phenomenology is foreign to the transcendental presumptions of phenomenology proper, it is still "consistent with a broader concept of phenomenology held by Husserl himself" (p. 73; see, e.g., Husserl 1968). Gallagher's solution appears promising. The project of naturalizing phenomenology in this sense is not self-vitiating; naturalized phenomenology is still a kind of phenomenology.
Importantly, Gallagher also takes up the issue of how phenomenology can be naturalized. In addressing this issue, he first presents briefly three general proposals of naturalizing phenomenology (pp. 76-81) and then shows how phenomenology has already contributed to a number of debates in the cognitive sciences (pp. 82-88). By the end of Gallagher's contribution we get a clear sense of what it means for him to naturalize phenomenology. To naturalize phenomenology is to allow for a respectful and mutually beneficial dialogue between phenomenology and the empirical sciences (pp. 88-9).
But couldn't one ask for a stronger conception of naturalizing phenomenology? That is, if we are willing to bracket the transcendental dimension of phenomenology, then why couldn't we have phenomenology (understood as phenomenological psychology) operating within a robustly physicalist outlook? (By "robustly physicalist outlook," I mean a metaphysical account of the nature of our world that holds that all phenomenal facts are metaphysically necessitated by, realized by, or supervenient upon, physical facts.) Gallagher resists "naturalistic reductionism" (p. 89). Although he doesn't elaborate on this idea, he conceives of such a reductionist project as one that aims to "ultimately explain consciousness in terms of physical processes" (p. 70). Without further articulating the nature of explanation at issue here, it is hard to tell whether such a reductionist project is incongruous with phenomenological psychology. I suspect that the operative notion of explanation in the passage that I quoted is one of a priori entailment: one explains consciousness in physical terms if one can show how phenomenal truths are a priori entailed by physical truths. Such an understanding of explanation would render the project of naturalizing phenomenology untenable; the role and place for phenomenological psychology would be threatened and ultimately supplanted. Be that as it may, not all varieties of physicalism make such epistemological commitments. Hence, the issue of whether phenomenological psychology is inimical to a robustly physicalist outlook, one which is explicit about dissociating its metaphysical commitments from its epistemological, is not settled. Perhaps after all one can have both: ontological reductionism and phenomenological psychology.
In "Intentionality without Representationalism," John J. Drummond juxtaposes two accounts of perception's nature, "presentationalism" and "representationalism", arguing for the former. By "representationalism," he means any account of perception that posits a triadic relationship between mind and world: between mind and world there is a (mediating) representational content. The existence of this representational content does not necessarily entail that perception is "indirect." Representationalism is consistent with the view that what one perceives (in cases of veridical perception or illusions) are mind-independent objects. Presentationalism differs from representationalism insofar as it rejects the existence of a mediating content and asserts a dyadic relation between mind and world. "The presentational account," Drummond writes, "draws no ontological distinction between the intentional object and the worldly, intended thing or state of affairs". Consequently, "the intentional object just is the intended thing or state of affairs but precisely as it is intended" (p. 123).
Drummond gives three reasons in favor of presentationalism: (a) only presentationalism preserves our pre-theoretical view of the mind as "open" to the world (p. 128); (b) even though representationalism is suggested by the possibility of illusions and hallucination, the manner in which it accounts for illusions and hallucination proves unsatisfactory (p. 130); and (c) despite common perceptions to the contrary, presentationalism adequately accounts for illusions and hallucinations. Let me comment briefly on the third reason and specifically on Drummond's account of hallucinations.
Hallucinations present known and pressing problems for relationalist or naïve realist views of perception such as presentationalism. For instance, proponents of disjunctivism -- a position that is often motivated by an antecedent acceptance of relationalism or naïve realism (see, e.g., Martin 2002, p. 402) and maintains that veridical perceptions and hallucinations involve mental states of different kinds -- have devoted considerable efforts to articulating hallucinatory experiences either positively (Johnston 2004, p. 171) or negatively (Martin 2004, p. 72). Drummond takes neither of these two options. He rejects the assumption -- common among proponents of disjunctivism -- that hallucinatory experiences are subjectively indistinguishable from veridical experiences. Unfortunately, Drummond does very little to motivate such a claim. He points out that "people experience hallucinations differently from how they experience perceptions" and adds that "the mere fact that we can even ask the question about hallucination indicates that we have an experiential way of distinguishing hallucinations from perceptions" (p. 130, emphasis mine). But this response misses the point. What is at stake here isn't whether actual or past hallucinations are indistinguishable from veridical experience, but whether it is metaphysically possible to have two experiences, one veridical and one hallucinatory, that are, from the point of the subject, indistinguishable. After all, isn't presentationalism an account of the necessary (if not also sufficient) features of perception? But not only does Drummond fail to argue against the possibility of a hallucination that is subjectively indistinguishable from a veridical experience, he also does nothing to deflate persisting intuitions in support of this possibility (see, e.g., Horgan and Tienson 2002, pp. 526-7).
Komarine Romdenh-Romluc's "Thought In Action," is one of the highlights of the volume. Drawing on Merleau-Ponty, she develops an account of action that parts ways with the traditional view according to which "actions are essentially brought about and guided by the agent's intentions" (p. 199). Of course, intentions do "play some role in at least some actions," but intentions aren't necessary for every action (p. 199). In developing her account, Romdenh-Romluc builds upon Merleau-Ponty's contention that the sensible world is given to us through our bodies. We perceive with our bodies, Merleau-Ponty tells us (2002, p. 239; 373; 380). Or more accurately, and given his assertion of the pre-personal nature of our body (2002, p. 296), our bodies perceive for us (see, e.g., 2002, p. 237, 277, and 374). In perceiving the world, we have already invested the objects of perception with meaning (see, e.g., 2002, pp. 40-42). Indeed, we apprehend environmental items in terms of action possibilities that they afford us. They solicit us or call for a certain kind of behavior (1967, p. 168; 2002, p. 245). The agent's behavior, Merleau-Ponty holds, is not only initiated but also controlled and sustained by such solicitations. We perceive action possibilities and we respond by acting without, as Romdenh-Romluc points out, "need[ing] to form a conceptual representation of the action, such as an intention" (p. 200).
But Romdenh-Romluc goes well beyond summarizing Merlau-Ponty's account of perception and action. She clearly articulates the role of thought in action and, importantly, accommodates it within a Merleau-Pontyian account of action (pp. 206-7). En route to doing so, Romdenh-Romluc rejects Dreyfus's account of action. She shows -- convincingly to my mind -- that Dreyfus' account is inadequate both as a reading of Merleau-Ponty and as an account of action in its own right. Ultimately, Romdehn-Romluc provides an attractive alternative to the traditional account of action.
In "Sex, Gender, and Embodiment," Sara Heinämaa criticizes accounts of sexual difference that are founded upon or make use of the concepts of sex and gender. Such accounts, she contends, are ultimately "inadequate for the analysis of the plurality of our bodily existence and sexual difference" (p. 228). On the one hand, accounts based on the concept of sex "only capture bodies as components of causal-functional nexuses and thus overlook rich areas of experience in which bodies appear as motivational, intentional, and expressive" (pp. 231-2). On the other hand, accounts based on the concept of gender "may present the body as invested with cultural significations and meanings, but [they don't] help us to capture the sense-forming aspects of embodiment or the body as a source of meaning" (p. 232). We need a new way of grounding and articulating our sexual natures. This much-needed alternative, Heinämaa holds, can be found in Husserl's account of embodiment. Such an account furnishes us with the appropriate concepts for analyzing and understanding human sexuality.
Dorothée Legrand's "Self-Consciousness and World-Consciousness," is another highlight of the volume. Legrand takes up the difficult task of articulating the nature of one's experience of oneself as a subject; that is, our consciousness of ourselves-as-subject. In doing so, she examines how this experience relates to one's experience of objects and to one's experience of oneself as an object. Legrand seamlessly weaves insights from Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, J. J. Gibson, and Jakob von Uexküll in arguing for an account of consciousness of oneself-as-subject that is neither reflective nor reflexive. It isn't reflective, for it isn't self-objectifying: consciousness of oneself-as-subject isn't reduced to consciousness of oneself-as-object. But consciousness of oneself-as-subject isn't reflexive either: the intentional object of this consciousness isn't the subject but the world. Consciousness of oneself-as-subject arises during the subject's interactions with the world. The subject experiences herself by experiencing the world.
In Walter Hopp's superb "The (Many) Foundations of Knowledge," phenomenology effortlessly comes in contact with contemporary epistemology. Hopp provides a phenomenological account of immediate (non-inferential) justification. In so doing, he demonstrates clearly how phenomenology can provide us with the means of defending foundationalism regarding the structure of knowledge. Employing Husserl's idea of "fulfillment," Hopp argues that perceptual experiences can provide non-inferential justification for the beliefs that they fulfill. Beliefs formed on the basis of fulfillment are epistemically basic -- no evidence in addition to what (present) experiences make available to us is needed to justify them. When fulfillment occurs, we believe that the world is a certain way because the world is presented to us in precisely the way that we believe it to be. And even though such beliefs are not infallible, fulfillment confers on them a high degree of justification so that they should count as knowledge. Foundational knowledge -- i.e., knowledge that is immediately justified -- is thus easy to come by.
In "Language and Non-Linguistic Thinking," Dieter Lohmar argues for the existence of non-linguistic forms of thinking in humans. Husserl's theory of meaning provides the theoretical framework of Lohmar's position. Crucial to his position is the relation between categorical acts and meaning-bestowing acts. The former are the "acts that are dedicated to become the ground for intuitive evidence of states of affairs" (p. 378). The latter are the acts that are responsible for conferring or giving meaning to symbolic representations or signs. What is characteristic of the relation between these two acts is a "difference" or "gap" (p. 380): whereas categorical intuition is a fulfilled intention, meaning-bestowing acts lack intuitive fulfillment (p. 381). According to Lohmar, it is precisely this difference that lends support to the claim that there can be non-linguistic thinking. What the difference shows, he maintains, is that "meaning-bestowing acts are not a necessary element of cognition understood as an independent intuition" (p. 380). More precisely, the "connection of categorical intuition with a meaning-bestowing act using language does not imply the necessity of such a connection (p. 381). Thus, we can have meaning-bestowing acts that are "performed" not only in a language other than one's native language but also, and most importantly, in another symbolic medium entirely.
Søren Overgaard's "Other People" is a marvelous contribution. His focus is the (epistemological) problem of other minds, namely, the issue of how we can justify the common belief that others have minds and mental states like ours. Drawing on ideas from Merleau-Ponty and Scheler, Overgaard explicates with remarkable clarity a perceptual solution to the problem of other minds, which, very briefly, holds that we are justified in believing that others have mental states because we directly perceive those states. The perceptual account should be contrasted to an inferential account, which holds that perception provides us with data on the basis of which we can infer the existence of other minds (p. 463).
Overgaard's essay is rich. In addition to presenting the perceptual solution, explicating the nature and commitments of such a solution, and arguing that a recently offered solution to the problem of other minds (Smith 2010) is inferential, he provides support for the perceptual solution and defends it from objections. It is worth commenting, even if briefly, on some of the reasons that Overgaard offers in favor of a perceptual model/solution.
He takes it as a datum that (at least sometimes) it seems to us that we directly perceive others' mental states and calls cases in which it seems to us that we perceive that someone is angry, sad, happy, etc. "P cases" (p. 466). By itself, the claim that P cases occur doesn't entail that we perceive mental states directly. P cases could be the result of habitual or automatic inferences. That is, the existence of P cases doesn't rule out the possibility that we are inferring the presence of mental states, even though we are unaware of the fact that we are engaging in any sort of inference.
Still, Overgaard maintains that there are good reasons to think that P cases are genuine cases of perception. Consequently, the inferential model is incapable of doing justice to the existence and phenomenology of P cases. Overgaard's argument takes the form of a modus tollens. If P cases are the result of inferences, then it should be possible to suppress P cases. In other words, if the fact that it seems to us that someone is angry is the result of an inference, then it should be possible to suppress or inhibit this appearance. But P cases can't be suppressed. They are not affected by our beliefs; we can't just make the looks go away. Therefore, they can't be the result of inference. Overgaard describes P cases as "cognitively impenetrable" (p. 467). Insofar as they are cognitively impenetrable, it's reasonable to hold that P cases are genuine cases of perception. Overgaard explains:
Can you refrain from judging that the person you see is angry? Easily -- if you know that the person is an award-winning actor rehearsing for a part in a movie, for example. But you cannot make the angry look go away. Regardless of what you know, the person will look angry to you. If this is true, then it seems plausible to say that cognitive impenetrability applies to some cases of detecting other's emotions by visual means. And if so, it seems reasonable to say that in those sorts of cases, the emotions are detected perceptually, not inferentially. (p. 467)
It's worth noting that all of the examples that Overgaard offers involve basic emotions (Ekman 1992). In the above quote, for instance, anger is the emotion that is directly perceived. He also mentions the perception of sadness and happiness as examples of P cases. But it's far from clear whether his account would also apply to more complex or subtle emotions or moods. Is it true, for instance, that I can't make the look of guilt, contempt, boredom, or shame go away? For what it's worth, I am inclined to answer this question negatively. Of course, a perceptual account of emotions doesn't necessarily have to claim that every emotion can be directly perceived. But does that mean that an adequate solution to the epistemological problem of other minds has to be hybrid? Do we directly perceive basic emotions and infer all others?
Most importantly, we need to ask whether Overgaard is right to hold that it's impossible to make certain looks (that of anger, for instance) go away. Suppose that you are observing the following scene. Stella and Oliver are having a heated conversation. Stella says something to Oliver. He becomes livid. He clenches his fists; his eyebrows are raised; he's breathing heavily and he's sweating. Now consider two variations of this scene.
Variation 1. Stella and Oliver are actors and they asked to practice in front of you a difficult scene for their upcoming play.
Variation 2. Stella and Oliver are your friends. While having dinner with them, they started fighting.
It seems compelling to me to hold that Oliver will look different to you in those two variations, even though, ex hypothesis, Oliver's behavior is identical in the two variations. Among other things, the real fight between Stella and Oliver will stir up in you certain emotions and those emotions will color, I think, the way that you perceive Oliver. Oliver will appear menacing or frightening. Suppose that you know that Oliver has a past of domestic violence. In that case you will perceive Oliver as having certain "darker" emotions. This example suggests that the way you perceive emotions can be influenced by your beliefs -- e.g., the belief that Oliver is not faking it, the belief that Oliver's behavior is hurtful to Stella, or the belief that Oliver might physically harm someone. Overgaard seems to accept this conclusion. In a statement that is relegated to a footnote, he writes "[d]epending on the background information you have, the [angry] person may strike you as vengeful, hateful, or perhaps even disgusted" (p. 467, n.12). But on the basis of this admission, it seems that not all P cases are cognitively impenetrable. Looks of emotions can change. They can certainly be enhanced. In variation 2, in addition to appearing angry, Oliver also seems vengeful, hateful, and even fearless. But if looks of emotions can change, insofar as they can be enhanced (or diminished), then maybe they can even be replaced by other looks. If on Overgaard's own admission, an angry person can strike you as disgusted, doesn't that suggest then that it is possible to make the angry look go away? That is to say, isn't it possible to replace the angry look with a disgusted look?
In "Something That Is Nothing but Can Be Anything: The Image and Our Consciousness of It," John Brough does a marvelous job of explaining the complex phenomenon of image consciousness which is the type of awareness that arises when one looks, for example, at a photograph or painting. It's neither memory nor phantasy (p. 545). Although it's similar, in certain respects, to perception, it would be a mistake to identify it with perception. Husserl's description of this mode of awareness as "perceptual re-presentation" (Husserl 2005, p. 565) captures well, I think, its peculiar character. Image consciousness is both perceptual and imaginary.
As Husserl recognized, image consciousness involves three distinct objects. Consider one of Rembrandt's self-portraits as an example. There is the physical object, the canvas; there is also the depicting object, in this case, the image of Rembrandt; and finally, there is the depicted object, Rembrandt, the man himself. It is by perceiving the canvas that the image of Rembrandt appears. Our perception of the canvas recedes into the background and allows the appearance of an image. And although Rembrandt the person doesn't appear -- only his image does -- Rembrandt is still meant. Image consciousness involves essentially the phenomenon of "seeing in" (pp. 550-3). In image consciousness, we see something in something else. We see a face in a canvas, a galloping horse in a mass of bronze.
But what is it about a physical object, such as a canvas, that "provokes" or "instigates" image consciousness? In the most thought-provoking part of his contribution, Brough argues that "images are able to represent through resemblance . . . [and that] there must be some resemblance if we are to experience an image and not just a sign" (p. 555). One obvious obstacle to insisting that resemblance is a necessary condition for image consciousness is abstract art. Assuming that image consciousness is the type of awareness operative when looking at an abstract painting, Brough owes us an account of what an abstract painting resembles. Brough tries to answer this question with the use of a specific example: Barnett Newman's Vir Heroicus Sublimis. Brough takes seriously Newman's claim that his painting has an "intellectual" or "metaphysical" content and holds that we can see things in paintings if we know enough about a painting (p. 560). As he writes: "Truly to see Newman's Vir Heroicus Sublimis -- to see in it its content -- involves bringing to it a fund of knowledge and insight about the subject and its way of being presented that straightforward perception may not be able to offer" (p. 561).
I am not entirely convinced by Brough's claims. What is precisely the difference in image consciousness between someone who knows a lot about the painting and someone who doesn't? Brough approvingly quotes Jonathan Fineberg stating that the painting "evokes the universe, the infinite" (p. 562). He adds: "the spread and the size of the painting exhibits an expansive idea of human nobility in an image that transcends the particular and lets the spectator see in it something of the nature of a universal condition, the sublimity and heroism of humanity" (p. 562). But is this description an accurate portrayal of our image consciousness or one made up to cohere with an antecedently accepted philosophical view about painting? Regardless of how one answers this question, I think that Brough's unquestioned conviction -- that "in the absence of resemblance in any sense, it is difficult to see how seeing-in and therefore imaging could occur at all" (p. 557) -- has deprived him the opportunity to consider the emotional power of abstract painting. Encountering a painting need not be, and most often isn't, an entirely intellectual matter (Elkins 2001; see also Elpidorou 2010).
In this review I have only scratched the surface of the rich and exciting material that awaits the reader. In addition to the essays that I mentioned above, six more outstanding entries are worth mentioning: Nicolas de Warren's contribution on forgiveness; D. W. Smith's analysis of the content of perception; David Carr's essay on the phenomenology of history; Donn Welton's phenomenological account of affectivity; Dan Zahavi's discussion of shame; and Anthony Steinbock's examination of religious experiences.
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It would be remiss of me to conclude this review without raising the following two points: First, OHCP contains no cross-references between entries despite the fact that connections between entries abound. The lack of cross-references is a missed opportunity for turning OHCP into a more organic whole and for increasing the number of essays a reader will read.
Second, OHCP contains twenty-eight essays, but only three of them are authored by women. Unfortunately, the low percentage of women contributors (or co-contributors) isn't a peculiarity of this particular volume. After glancing at the table of contents of forty-five Oxford Handbooks in philosophy, I found that fewer than 20% of contributions are either authored or co-authored by women. (Excluded from this calculation are editorial and section introductions.) The numbers are worse for racial minorities. The obvious solution is for editors to invite more women and minorities to contribute. They should also include essays on underrepresented topics; for example, OHCP could have included essays on Africana and Vietnamese phenomenology. A handbook doesn't necessarily need to contain entries written exclusively by well-established philosophers. It only needs to include well-argued and well-written essays. Of course, one can and should give credit to authors that have been influential in a field. But inviting them to contribute isn't the only way to do this. The editor, for instance, can acknowledge their importance in the introduction. The aim of producing more diverse Oxford Handbooks is not only laudable but also attainable.
I am grateful to Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Lauren Freeman, Walter Hopp, Jake Hoskins, and Jo-Jo Koo for comments on a draft version of this review.
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