2020.10.10

Joseph C. Pitt

Heraclitus Redux: Technological Infrastructures and Scientific Change

Joseph C. Pitt, Heraclitus Redux: Technological Infrastructures and Scientific Change, Rowman & Littlefield, 2020, 115pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786612359.

Reviewed by Matthew D. Lund, Rowan University


Joseph C. Pitt's slim new book argues persuasively that the philosopher's traditional focus on theories as the essence of science is misplaced. This kind of objection is frequently leveled at philosophers by historians and those in science studies, and for good reason. Pitt's critique is much broader and more interesting than the typical one since he argues that the notion of a technological infrastructure -- which, to some degree, becomes the new locus of analysis -- is a complex, extended, and historically conditioned thing that can at best be only partially and imperfectly surveyed, and is, needless to say, not the unique possession of any one discipline.

Pitt's book begins with an impassioned call for Heraclitian inquiry to replace the stagnant "Perennial Philosophy" bequeathed to us by Parmenides and Plato. Philosophy and science are still haunted by the mad idea that the goal of all our searchings can only be a single timeless picture of reality. In place of the traditional "frozen-dialogue" view (6), Pitt argues that the world is a continuously changing thing that evolves along with our protean technological infrastructures. When we ask a question about our knowledge of some part of the world, the answer will inevitably involve many features of our current technological infrastructure. If we want evidence for common descent or the Big Bang, we don't merely consult theory and data, but we implicitly refer to all kinds of aspects of the technological infrastructure. In fact, our theories and data would not exist were it not for a technological infrastructure.

As we all struggle through the COVID-19 pandemic, several of Pitt's reflections on the nature of technological infrastructures come through powerfully. Libraries and laboratories, insofar as they require people to work together in enclosed spaces, have been largely shut down. The production of many goods critical to our technological infrastructure -- like computers, smartphones, and instruments -- has been impeded. Medical research into infectious diseases like malaria have been halted as the resources are shifted to deal with the COVID-19 emergency. Even routine health operations like childhood vaccinations for diseases like measles have fallen off, opening up other epidemic possibilities for the future. It is quite easy to see how the technological infrastructure has changed in 2020, and while it is natural to regard such changes as temporary, as mere hiccups, many of these changes will be here to stay, and our capacity to do things in the world will have changed. Our conception of science will also have changed as a result, even if such changes are not immediately obvious to us.

Since our knowledge and access to the world are mediated by the technological infrastructure of science, Pitt argues that we should all be good Heraclitians. Pitt distinguishes two forms of Heraclitianism: an epistemic one and a metaphysical one. While one could argue for the epistemological thesis that our knowledge of the world is in constant flux without breaking a sweat, Pitt opts for the more radical view that the world itself changes as our technological infrastructures change. Pitt's thesis here is rendered more interesting by his broad and inclusive understanding of a technological infrastructure. However, to arrive at a complete understanding of scientific change, we need to understand the role of history. How and why do technological infrastructures change? Are the changes improvements? How do social and ethical concerns influence the changes in technological infrastructures?

Pitt tries to articulate a role for history in understanding scientific change by carefully avoiding standard forms of unenlightening historiography. There are so many instances of 'history behaving badly' that historians have solemnly laid down a system of 'thou shalt nots', like Whig History, Universalism, Modernism, Abstraction, and Internalism (9-11) that the virtuous, dutiful historian is to steer clear of. Of course, this is all easier said than done, and the main result of abstinence from these five deadly historical sins is that one ends up with precious little to say. Contextualism has arisen as a potential path to informative history: the contemporary contextualist historian focuses on individual actors, and tries to render their actions intelligible by filling in the social and political details. Pitt finds contextualism needlessly limited in two main respects: it supposes that there is one single best explanation to be found and that there exists a clear principle of historical data selection. Pitt seeks to replace contextualism with a new approach that sees the notion of a "problematic" as the starting point. A problematic is a set of issues that are of concern for a group of inquirers (as opposed to contextualism, which Pitt characterizes as dealing only with individuals) over some period of time. A possible example of a problematic could be the 18th century quest for an accurate means of determining longitude. Longitude was primarily important for the purposes of navigation, trade, and war; something seemed to be missing from the 18th century technological infrastructure -- there was something people wanted to be able to do that they just could not do successfully in their extant technological infrastructure. While the initial motivations were to come up with some kind of astronomical measurement of longitude, modern horology eventually emerged as the celebrated technological product of the quest. As more precise ways of measuring time came to characterize the technological infrastructure of the science of the 18th and 19th centuries, the practice of many individual sciences was transformed, as can be seen in the history of physics, astronomy, and psychology. Returning to the COVID-19 case, there is a fairly clear and conscious problematic motivating all kinds of mutations and developments in the fabric of the technological infrastructure of science.

In Chapter 2, Pitt demonstrates how artistic inquiries into visual representation led to the development of a mathematical theory of perspective. How things looked and how they ought to be pictorially portrayed were understood by Renaissance artists to be distinguishable, and the notion that representations depended on instruments and interpretation cleared the path for the development of the instrumental observations of the telescope and the microscope:

The scientist of the 17th century started on the long road to specifying what it meant to observe nature, which turned out to be a complicated job of balancing seeing, interpreting, instruments, and measuring. In order to undertake this job, they had to rely on what the artists had earlier achieved in terms of mathematizing visualization. (28)

Pitt concludes from this discussion that observation is, thus, not some merely passive seeing, but a form of doing, and as such it is dependent on a technological infrastructure.

In Chapter 3, Pitt shows how Galileo's use of the telescope, as publicized in his Sidereus Nuncius of 1610, caused the downfall of the Aristotelian conception of the cosmos. Thus, technological development forces large-scale changes in scientific theory. In Chapter 4, the distinction between pure and applied science is criticized, leading to discussions in the following chapters of how the notions of science and technology simpliciter are empty, and that there is no such thing as either scientific or technological progress.

Finally, Pitt closes the book with a discussion of a Heraclitian philosophy of enquiry. Here he claims that technological infrastructures are what allow 'humanity at work' to prosper. We must use the tools that lie to hand, and we should try to plot out the future courses of technological development so we can figure out where we are headed. In particular, Pitt worries about the law of unintended consequences -- we tend only to realize how destructive our technological developments are once it is too late -- and he ends the book with a sobering recognition that some technological infrastructures (possibly, the one we currently have) may be hell-bent on total annihilation.

Let us now turn to a critical assessment of some of the main arguments of the book. Just as N.R. Hanson tried to understand terms like "observation", "causation", and "experiment" in a quasi-empirical way by studying their use in scientific contexts, Pitt broadens the scope from mere linguistic usage (and the implicit inferential structures underlying it) to embrace large-scale social, economic, political, and technological structures. On Pitt's view, if we want to know whether an observation is reliable or why a design for a space telescope failed, we would need to look to the technological infrastructure. One might expect that all of the standard terms in scientific epistemology might be redefined in terms of the technological infrastructure of science. However, it is not entirely clear whether such a definitional project is one to which Pitt is committed. In several sections of the book, he seems like he is engaging with such a project, but then the discussions seem to leave off prematurely. For instance, in Chapter 7, Pitt argues that all theories of scientific progress are flawed because they are committed to a single goal for science, and indeed, "there is no such thing as scientific progress". (67) However, towards the end of that chapter, he concedes that problems are solved by individual sciences, in Laudan's sense, and that such successes are what lead to changes in technological infrastructures and associated theories, but that "such change is not progress in any meaningful way." (75) When embracing pragmatism in Chapter 1, Pitt states that "the mark of knowledge is successful action. Successful action in the world by individuals requires what I call common sense pragmatism. This is the process of learning from experience and revising false assumptions." (6) Is it too much to claim that learning from experience in the realm of science constitutes some form of scientific progress? In Chapter 8, Pitt argues against the idea of technological progress by stating that, for example, the smartphone does not represent progress relative to the land-line phone since the two are just entirely different pieces of technology. Again, this argument seems specious on Pitt's own terms. If the two items spring from similar, historically related problematics and technological infrastructures, it would seem that the one is an improvement on the other since it does many things the other could not do. Pitt's insistence on the essential difference of the two is certainly a case of being consistently Heraclitian, but this position conflicts with nearly all the interesting contributions of the book. After exorcising the notion of technological progress, Pitt concludes that the neutral notion of technological development should be the focus.

In his discussion of progress, Pitt relies on Peirce's thought. He argues that we should distinguish Pierce's theory of reality (which is the main item he discusses) from his theory of scientific progress. He objects to Peirce's notion that reality is the view of the world disclosed by ultimate inquiry since it erects a single goal for science. However, Peirce's discussion of conceptions, and their pragmatic value, would seem to be much more to the point. When a new conception quiets preexisting doubts, inquiry has -- for the moment at least -- succeeded. As more and more of our doubts are neutralized through the continuous fashioning of new conceptions (some of which might only be constructible via a technological infrastructure), that seems again like scientific progress. Also, in Peirce's discussions of reality and ultimate inquiry, the emphasis is not on the desirability of this distant goal. It is instead a way of defining reality in terms of inquiry itself, and this seems like an idea that aligns with Pitt's inclinations. However, if a notion like inquiry is to make any sense in the pragmatic tradition, some normative notion like success, learning, or progress must be present.

Pitt claims that technological infrastructures are logically prior to science, intending somewhat to shock the reader by turning the tables:

we have the sciences we do because they are embedded in certain technological infrastructures that facilitate certain ways of doing things and discourage others. This leads me to the conclusion that it is the technology that drives the science and not the other way around. Or to coin a phrase -- it is technology all the way down. (15-16, italics in original).

However, it would seem more accurate to say that technological infrastructures and science are abstractable, interdependent components of a vast, complex system. There may be times when focusing on science, a tidy and useful abstraction, is a good idea. For instance, if we are interested in pedagogy, the idea of science as an intellectual collection of laws and facts may be inescapable because it is -- despite continuous efforts at reform -- a pretty good way to teach. Similarly, if we are attacked by a pandemic, we are most keen to discover and use the scientific facts of the matter. The technological infrastructure is, no doubt, extremely important, but there are often very good pragmatic reasons why the analysis of it is not to our purpose. These remarks are not intended as a criticism of Pitt's final views -- it is likely that he himself may well agree with them. Instead, they are meant as a critique of the easily drawn consequences of the views expressed in the book.

The most serious critique of the book is that Heraclitianism is only adumbrated in a sketchy way, and it is not appealed to consistently. If reality itself is constantly changing -- which it would be if one really is a Heraclitian -- such changes are not the result of unseen underlying unities. While the Heraclitian theme is grand and attractive, it does not seem that Pitt cleaves unto that theme all that closely. In fact, one might argue that the notion of Heraclitianism is itself in constant flux throughout the book. For example, in Chapter 6, Pitt begins loading the Heraclitianism with all kinds of pragmatic, common sense, and progressive virtues: "what a Heraclitian technological philosophy of science looks like is very much like common sense." (60) "While the history of science is the history of failed theories, investigating those theories was needed to get us where we are today. Look at it as investing in the future." (59). Thus, here we encounter a Heraclitianism that is not continuous flux, but rather a form of temporally organized progress. This is not to say that the views Pitt expresses here are wrong; they just do not appear to be consistent with anything one might call Heraclitian. Pitt goes on to detail the importance of feedback loops in the process of technological development and, again, the notion of a feedback loop seems to involve the assumption that one is feeding back relative to an earlier state of one and the same system, a very non-Heraclitian idea. More seriously, Pitt's deviations from a naïve Heraclitianism are asserted without much in the way of argument. Pitt closes the book with a moving exhortation on the imminent destruction of our planet as a result of greed, corruption, and political incompetence. A topic like this hardly seems like a matter that can be looked upon with Heraclitian spectacles. How can normativity and human purposes enter into a debate when the very world itself is constantly changing?

The book feels somewhat like a collection of interesting historical studies bookended by some philosophical analysis. The main problem is that the philosophical lessons and the history only speak to one another at rare intervals, and somewhat haltingly when they do so. Some of the chapters are so brief that they read like vignettes, though Pitt intends them to be much more than that. Also, while Pitt certainly writes well, the book does suffer from insufficient revision work.

Nevertheless, the book is recommended, particularly for philosophers of science, since it tries (with varying degrees of success) to route past familiar, simplistic, and largely empty philosophical formulas on the way to new pathways for understanding science and technology. The most sympathetic and productive way to look at Pitt's volume is to see it as marking out a cooperative project for philosophy and Science and Technology Studies (STS). The book emerged from Pitt's decades of collaboration with scientists and STS scholars, and most philosophers of science would agree that engagement in substantial interdisciplinary dialogue is essential for the discipline's health and survival. While many of Pitt's arguments and positions require more development, discussion, and refinement, he does point philosophers of science in an interesting and fruitful direction.