Mark LeBar (ed.)


Mark LeBar (ed.), Justice, Oxford University Press, 2018, 292pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190631758.

Reviewed by Alejandra Mancilla, University of Oslo

The Rawlsian motto that "justice is the first virtue of social institutions" has had such a pervasive influence since A Theory of Justice was published, in 1971, that nowadays the standard way of thinking about justice is at a societal scale, in connection with the state and the way it is organized. This has obscured the fact that, historically, justice was understood primarily as an individual virtue, on a par with other virtues like beneficence, courage and temperance. Starting from this diagnosis, this collection seeks to address this relative neglect of justice as a quality of character to be cultivated and perfected, and it does so from a wide array of disciplines.

As part of a series aimed at presenting different virtues from a multidisciplinary perspective (Humility and Sustainability are forthcoming), the book includes contributions from philosophers, historians of ideas, political scientists, psychologists, primatologists, anthropologists, economists and legal scholars. The editor, Mark LeBar, acknowledges in the introduction the main risk of such an enterprise: the essays might end up talking past each other, using the same term to refer to wildly different matters. The way to ensure that a red thread unites them all, LeBar claims, is by focusing not on the question of what justice as a virtue of character means, but rather on how it is acquired, exercised and eventually perfected. The underlying assumption is that "we" already share a common notion of what a just person looks like: someone who treats others and their property with respect, who distributes shares fairly, and who -- in short -- succeeds in giving to each their due.

With ten newly commissioned articles (although in some cases drawing heavily from the authors' previous works), the resulting collection is a variegated read.

Philosopher and classics professor Paul Woodruff sets the scene by presenting a Platonic (and at times Confucian) account of justice as a virtue of both communities and individuals. While all humans seem to have a natural sense of justice, to "grow" towards justice as a virtue is a long-term undertaking. His definition of the virtues, in fact, is that of "lifelong projects requiring a serious commitment" (23). A crucial feature is the interplay between justice at the community level and at the individual level, where each requires the other. At the collective level, justice is expressed through procedural law; at the individual level, it is a form of wisdom. A context-sensitive capacity, it is not about following rules blindly, but about adapting them to the particular circumstances. The point is to give everyone their due, and also to ensure that everyone feels like they have actually got it. Towards the end, Woodruff speculates about the conditions needed for justice to grow in individuals. This part reads a bit like a self-help manual, with pieces of advice like "you have opportunities to practice justice; for this, it is ideal for you to have opportunities for leadership from an early age", "you are practicing to know yourself", and "you are observing the human landscape and learning to appreciate the hidden merits of people around you" (28-29). Considering that many of the "weeds" that prevent one from growing towards justice depend on the environment rather than the individual, one wonders how useful these pieces of advice are. At the same time, Woodruff's general message makes sense: that one cannot judge the individual development of the virtue of justice in abstraction from the circumstances.

Ryan P. Hanley proposes that the political, minimalistic understanding of justice among Enlightenment thinkers tells only half of the story of how they conceived of it. Focusing on Adam Smith, Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Immanuel Kant, Hanley wishes to show how all of them developed important insights into the moral psychology of justice, and into how our natural sentiments might be geared towards its promotion. For Rousseau, two natural feelings are at the core of the development of justice as a virtue: pity (pitié), which restrains damaging behavior towards others; and love of self (amour de soi), which makes us see justice first and foremost as something which is owed to us. The preference of each person for herself is in fact what roots the concept of justice. Perhaps the best-known passage of Adam Smith on justice is where he claims that "we may often fulfill all the rules of justice by sitting still and doing nothing". [1] However, Hanley notes that this distracts from Smith's rich moral psychology of justice, centered on three moral sentiments: sympathy (a capacity that, when developed, allows us to put ourselves in the place of impartial spectators of our own conduct and that of others); resentment (which leads us to defend ourselves and others from unjust harm); and guilt (which affects our desire for psychological tranquility and which we thus try to avoid). Finally, Hanley turns to Kant's anthropological writings, and claims that his thoughts about the importance of sympathy in grounding justice echo to some extent Rousseau and Smith. This contradicts the familiar story of Kant's sharp separation between the roles of sentiment and reason in morality.

Economist Bart J. Wilson, examines how property emerges in virtual economies out of a "state of nature". Starting from David Hume's claim that property is conventional (i.e. there is no such a thing as one's "due" before we have agreed on some rules), Wilson presents observations which suggest that participants in web-created economies with unallocated goods "become just" as they negotiate the rules of appropriation. For a reader not habituated to experimental economics, the description of the experiments is hard to follow, especially given that some of the explanations refer to colored squares, but the supporting illustrations are in black and white. Considering that the participants in the experiments cited were all WEIRD individuals (Western Educated, Industrial, Rich and Democratic), the results come as no surprise: it is to be expected that people born and raised under a stable system of property rights will try to replicate those rules in a "lawless" arena, knowing -- from experience -- that these rules will eventually promote their self-interest and diminish harm being done to them. More interesting (especially in connection with Sarah Brosnan's contribution below) is Wilson's claim that resentment and sympathy, two key moral sentiments in Smith's moral theory, are guiding when choosing cooperators and ostracizing non-cooperators.

Next, with the aim of counterbalancing and complementing WEIRD studies of justice as the one above, Thomas Widlok presents anthropological findings that suggest a complex picture of how the notions of sharing and redistributing goods justly are established depending on the context. Based on studies conducted among children from hunter-gatherer and agropastoral communities in Africa and Europe, Widlok claims that agropastoralists tend to make their sharing depend on how much each has done for gaining their part, while for hunter-gatherers the "merit" factor is irrelevant. [2] This divide suggests that different social economies have different standards of what constitutes justice and fairness. These are learnt and internalized through everyday practice more than through formal, externally imposed instruction.

Developmental psychologists Elliot Turiel, Audun Dahl, and Zinaida Besirevic present an analysis of how children and adolescents reason about moral issues -- mainly justice, welfare and rights. Rather than following a set of rules and conventions blindly, individuals contextualize these rules in daily practice and apply them weighing different considerations. This explains, for example, why "white lies" are not as negatively evaluated as self-serving lies: while deception is generally recognized as wrong, there might be competing values like welfare that, in a certain situation, take priority over honesty. The authors also underline the crucial role that emotions play in our moral judgments. Contra emotivist-intuitionist positions like Jonathan Haidt's (where moral judgments are interpreted as post hoc rationalizations of emotional reactions [3]), they deny, however, the sharp distinction between reason and emotion, and see them as operating in concert. The last section is devoted to what they provisionally call "moral sentiments", defined as "a set of broad concerns that are central and binding for most people and are viewed as obligatory" (121). A sui generis definition indeed, these moral sentiments include the value of life, respect for persons and dignity. The sources used by the authors to demonstrate their universal prevalence are, moreover, wildly heterogeneous: from philosophical theories (like Ronald Dworkin's and Martha Nussbaum's), to "common" reactions to trolley-cases, to individual interviews which -- they admit -- are work-in-progress.

Sarah Brosnan traces human norms of justice and fairness to other species, suggesting they are the result of biologically evolved behavior. Going through a number of studies conducted roughly in the last decade, she shows that other species (especially primates, but not only them) respond negatively to perceived inequalities, that is, they dislike being treated worse than the other members of their group. Furthermore, some of them are also sensitive to advantageous inequity, i.e. to being treated better than the others (and sometimes they respond to this by trying to equalize the outcomes). Together with Frans De Waal, Brosnan has identified the first phenomenon as "first-order fairness", and interpreted it as a key component to maintaining cooperation. [4] The second phenomenon, "second-order fairness", seems to manifest itself mostly among humans, which for Brosnan shows a more developed capacity to understand that small short-term losses may lead to big long-term gains. By understanding the evolutionary roots of fairness, he concludes, we might be able to design institutions that better promote cooperation.

While the previous essays are all circumscribed within their disciplines, in "The Dialectical Activity of Becoming Just", philosopher Jon Garthoff attempts to connect Lawrence Kohlberg's theory of moral cognitive development with philosophical theories of virtue acquisition. Although it may seem obvious to draw such a link, Garthoff claims, the fact is that it has remained mostly unexplored. One reason for this might be the negative criticism to which Kohlberg's theory of moral developmental stages has been subjected to (most prominently by Carol Gilligan [5]). Still, he thinks there are important insights from the theory that deserve attention if one is interested in the process of virtue acquisition. The way to bring them together is via Talbot Brewer's notion of "dialectical activity", to wit, those activities with which we become more engaged the more we engage in them. [6] How is the acquisition of justice in particular such an activity? Drawing from Woodruff's chapter, Garthoff lists a few characteristics: it requires a long-term commitment (typical of many activities of this kind); it requires a social background that promotes its flourishing, and it requires reciprocity. Finally, drawing from Kohlberg, Garthoff identifies developmental sub-stages in the process of virtue acquisition, and the absence of backsliding. He concludes, somewhat unexpectedly, with his views on how to become just in non-ideal circumstances.

Starting from Miranda Fricker's seminal work, Epistemic Injustice, philosopher Alan Thomas discusses whether epistemic injustices -- i.e. those that we impose on each other as knowers -- may be redressed by the practice of individual, "corrective virtues", or whether a full-fledged, institutional response is required. [7] Thomas focuses on testimonial injustice, that is, when people get too much or too little credit as knowers because of their identity, or their belonging to a particular group. His answer is that both Fricker and her critics have a point to make. On the one hand, many of the phenomena labelled as testimonial injustice cannot possibly be prevented by the state, unless one is ready to endorse an illiberal, invasive version of it. In that sense, Fricker is right to underline the importance of the cultivation of the epistemic virtues of justice. On the other hand, to prevent the pattern of domination that testimonial injustice results in when performed systematically, a democratic ethos has to be promoted by the state, to facilitate the practice of these virtues.

As Widlock did in his contribution, May Sim ("Confucian Values and Resources for Justice") attempts to look at non-Western views of justice. A specialist in ancient philosophy and in comparative philosophy (East-West), Sim responds to a challenge posed to Confucianism by Jiwei Ci. Ci's rendering of Confucian ethical theory is that, insofar as it is focused mainly on hierarchical relationships within the family and the state, it downplays the role for relationships among equals and, therefore, justice (a word that, incidentally, has no literal translation in Chinese). [8] On the contrary, Sim argues, in pointing to the importance of friendship and to its role as a bridge between familial and state relations, Confucianism does provide the basis for equal treatment and respect for others' self-determination and freedom. A self-identified Confucian state like China, she concludes in a rather ad hoc manner, should thus recognize the importance of individual self-determination. Against the picture that we have tended to hold as Westerners, Sim thus sees in Confucianism the conceptual resources to justify the main democratic values that we hold so dearly.

Normative legal theory asks what law should be like, and has taken two dominant lines: consequentialist or deontological. According to the former, laws are evaluated from a pragmatic point of view, looking at their contribution to the general welfare. According to the latter, laws are evaluated in terms of their protection of values like autonomy, liberty and individual rights. In the last chapter, Matthew A. Edwards discusses a third, less known approach to normative legal theory: "virtue jurisprudence", namely, the idea that law should serve as a tool to inculcate the virtue of justice in individuals, allowing them to express their human excellence. As Edwards rightly anticipates, this approach turns on at least two red lights. First, if legislation is going to have as its goal the promotion of individual virtue, then autonomy will be violated. Second, it is questionable whether law can in fact achieve this goal. It is one thing to force people to act as if they were virtuous (something that law can certainly achieve through sanctions). It is a different thing to turn them into truly virtuous individuals, who do the right action not because of fear, but because they have a certain character. Despite these challenges, however, Edwards thinks of the rise of virtue jurisprudence as a wake-up call for the dominant legal discourse in the U.S. in the last decades, with its neutral approach to regulation.

All in all, this collection is a welcome contribution towards resuscitating the discussion about justice as an individual virtue, and to do so not by focusing on conceptual analysis, but on its actual, everyday practice. If one follows the Smithian spirit and understands virtues as moral sentiments shaped by reason and directed towards our flourishing as humans, then it makes sense to try and have a grasp of when and how these sentiments emerge in the first place, what influence the environment has in their development, and how their expression may vary across cultures and contexts. Another laudable feature of this volume is the genuine attempt among the authors to relate to the others' contributions (something that works particularly well in Garthoff's cross-referencing to Woodruff). This gives the whole, despite its multidisciplinarity and methodological diversity, a common core which is hard to find in edited works of this kind.

While experts on the topic will probably not find much new in this volume, it will be a valuable read for those interested more generally in the manifold manifestations of this virtue, and (at a more meta level) in the manifold methodologies through which one can try and answer the deceivingly simple question: what is justice?


[1] Adam Smith, Theory of Moral Sentiments (Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1982), 82.

[2] Marie Schäfer, Daniel B.M. Haun and Michael Tomasello, "Fair is not Fair Everywhere", Psychological Science 26, no. 8 (2015): 1252-60.

[3] Jonathan Haidt, "The Emotional Dog and its Rational Tail: A Social Intuitionist Approach to Moral Judgment", Psychological Review 108 (2001): 814-834.

[4] Sarah Brosnan and Frans de Waal, "Evolution of Responses to (Un)Fairness", Science 346, no. 6207 (2014): 314-322.

[5] Carol Gilligan, In A Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women's Development (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 1982)

[6] Talbot Brewer, "The Retrieval of Ethics", Analysis 71, no. 1 (2009): 193-195.

[7] Miranda Fricker, Epistemic Injustice. Power and the Ethics of Knowing (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007). For a critique of Fricker's "corrective virtues" as insufficient to redress epistemic justice, see Elizabeth Anderson, "Epistemic Justice as a Virtue of Social Institutions", Social Epistemology 26, no. 2 (2007): 163-173.

[8] Jiwei Ci, "The Confucian Relation Concept of the Person and Its Modern Predicament", in Personhood and Health Care, eds. D.C. Thomasma, D.N. Weisstub, C. Herve (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 2001).