2018.05.12

Ivo Assad Ibri

Kósmos Noetós

Ivo Assad Ibri, Kósmos Noetós: The Metaphysical Architecture of Charles S. Peirce, Springer, 2017, 114 pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9873319663135.

Reviewed by Rosa M. Calcaterra, Roma Tre University


The English translation from the Portuguese language edition of Ivo Assad Ibri's pioneering book is very welcome news for the international community of scholars of Charles S. Peirce as well as a precious enrichment of the classic Anglo-American bibliography in the field. According to the original intention of its author, this work proves to be a "heuristic adventure" (xiii) through some of Peirce's writings which were still somewhat unexplored at that time of its first publication (1992). The great value of this book is to foster an integrated and systemic approach to Peirce's works routed through his scientific metaphysics. Ibri contends that the ontological architecture of Peirce's philosophy allows a more intelligible existential understanding of his semiotic logic and pragmatism.

The book has three main sections, and their length is proportioned to the relevance of the topics examined in each part for the construction of Ibri's argument. The first section, "The World as Appearance", is dedicated to a recovery of Peirce's phenomenological categories of experience. The second and longest section, "The World as Reality", is a longer path through Peirce's Logic and Ontology which aims to ground his Cosmological assumption of the Mind-World continuity. The third and last section, "The Knowable World", focuses on the relationship between Cosmology and Pragmatism. Quotations from a number of great poets and novelists, like Proust, Rimbaud, Borges, and Eliot introduce each chapter.

Ibri's hermeneutic strategy develops through a direct dialogue with Peirce's works, almost exclusively concentrating on a close reading of a wide range of original texts -- not only those included in the Collected Papers. Through an initial survey of Peirce's phenomenological categories, the author addresses the conception of experience intended as a "corrective factor of thought" (4). This is a leading conception which the author wishes to demonstrate is fundamental in all Peirce's philosophy. The phenomenological basis of experience being established, the right perspective to assume to investigate "the underlying reality in the inventory of appearances" is "the cognitive universe of Metaphysics" (19). Therefore, in the second chapter, the author analyses the relation of Metaphysics and Logic as "an experiential or positive science" (19), whose domain is extended beyond the "merely formal aspect of thought" (20), to show the ontological character of the latter. Grounding Peirce's realism by expanding on the concepts of existence and reality proves to be a necessary step to comprehend both the doctrines of Absolute Chance and Evolutionism in relation to Peirce's ontology (chapter 3) and the theories of Objective Idealism and Continuum, which are fundamental to his metaphysical system (chapter 4). The fifth chapter is entirely dedicated to Cosmology, or "the white elephant" of Peirce's Metaphysics (xix), which constitutes the book's turning point: it resumes and explains the previous arguments while leading to Ibri's theoretical reconstruction of Peirce's Pragmatism in the light of metaphysics. The fecundity of this perspective for pragmatism is more fully developed in the following chapters (6 and 7).

In the first chapter, Phenomenology is settled as the starting point of any normative science. As such, according to Peirce, the world of phenomena requires three ordinary faculties to be experienced and shaped, which Ibri sums up as seeing, heeding, and generalizing. To express what the capacity of seeing is for Peirce, Ibri uses the evocative words of Fernando Pessoa, which imply a sort of unlearning of how we have previously learned to experience. Among the corresponding three universal phenomenological categories, Ibri strategically first focuses on secondness to stress the ordinary perception that "the course of things is not subject to our will and that it often contradicts the idea we make of it" (6). The idea of alterity emerges in the "brute" experience of reaction and carries with it the idea of negation, which is deeply connected to Peirce's anti-Cartesian conception of the emergence of the Ego. The dynamic and evolutionary process of learning theoretically and practically that characterizes the ego/non-ego phenomenological dialectics is paradigmatic of the particular-general relation in all Peirce's philosophy.  As Ibri explains: "the generality of thirdness is the representation of particulars that will mediate future action -- action that will occur in a crosscut of time and space, by which the universe of the individuals of secondness is characterized" (13). However, taking a step back, "The ego as non-ego mediated in a general representation and derived from the factuality of lived experience has the nature of thought, that is, once the fabric of thought contains the generality of the concept" (8). Phenomenological firsts are instead unconditioned and unrelated qualities of phenomena. According to Ibri, "the unconditionality of feeling in relation to time distinguishes it from something factual. This makes of it only a state of immediate consciousness" (9). A "poetic way of looking", that is, an unmediated way of seeing the world as it is present to us, is an essential phenomenological faculty in Ibri's view. The unconditioned nature of phaneron deals with the notions of freedom and variety, and Ibri underlines Peirce's use of the term "spontaneity" for "the variety presented to nature" (11).

At the level of Phenomenology, where the immediate consciousness breaks with past and future, the internal/external distinction is not neatly differentiated. However, the question about the objectivity of time emerges through the dialectics between freedom and variety in phenomena. Ibri stresses Peirce's definition of the third category of consciousness as "synthetic consciousness, binding time together, sense of learning, thought" (CP 1.377). This consciousness carries on the sense of temporality which can be understood as characteristic of every cognition -- though, as Ibri specifies, not in a very Kantian way (13). Therefore, the phenomenological analysis of the structure of experience reveals the extensionality of the synthetizing consciousness as a medium between past and future actions. This is to say, it introduces purposes in human action without necessarily committing itself to metaphysical claims. Metaphysics is introduced when we investigate the "reality of thirdness  . . .  and thus  . . .  suppose that there is something of a general nature in the exteriority to which our thought conforms" (14).

In the next chapter, Ibri investigates the meaning of Peirce's notion of reality and experience within the science of Metaphysics. Moving from the concern mentioned above about the objectivity of time, he joins Peirce in thinking metaphysically about the unity of being which experience seems phenomenologically to suggest. More specifically, his inquiry addresses the "possibility of a synthesis of objective time and its rupture within the variety observed in the world, as experienced in the immediate consciousness of firstness, as if compelled to the synthesis of the phenomena under the being of the same category" (20). Relying on Logic as a guide for metaphysical reasoning, the phenomenological categories are translated in metaphysics as Chance, Existence, and Law. Ibri underlines interesting aspects connected to the principle of Chance and Law, namely Peirce's "indeterministic" ontology and evolutionism. The third chapter offers relevant insights into Peirce's probabilistic conception of the inexactness of scientific knowledge, a theme which is now again gaining interest among pragmatist scholars. According to Ibri, Peirce's epistemological fallibilism relies on ontology:

The ontological substratum of Fallibilism is, on the one hand, the acknowledgement of Chance as a real principle, responsible for the distancing of the fact in relation to law, and, on the other hand, the interlacing between Chance and law configuring Evolutionism. Evolutionism, as it is conceptualized, is thus the core of Fallibilism. (43-44)

Evolution means growth as thirdness to Peirce, and this definition leads Ibri to investigate Peirce's radical realism. At the beginning of the fourth chapter, he insists on the dynamic image of the universe presupposed by Peirce. However, he is well aware of the eidetic character of such a universe and its possible essentialist reading. Ibri's strategy is to show the germs of Peirce's objective idealism that can be tracked in his realistic instances. According to Ibri, Peirce's analysis of the "fabric of reality reveals its intellectual nature. The natural affinity between representation and reality eliminates the nominalist barrier between subject and object, or between consciousness and the world" (47). Natural processes seem intelligible because they seem rational: "its processes are seen to be like processes of thought" (46). Peirce's cosmos thus reveals itself to be Noetón [intelligible] as our thought is. And as phenomenological reflection shows, there are no neat frontiers between "an external universe and an inner world of thought" (CP 7.438). Given that the doctrine of objective idealism removes the mind-matter discontinuity (50), Synechism remains the other crucial conception to investigate in Peirce's Metaphysics as it extends from ontology to epistemology.

Within the dialectics of Chance and Law within an evolutionist metaphysical view, the issue of ontogenesis emerges and is deeply analyzed in chapter 5. Ibri emphasizes Peirce's reinterpretation of Platonic Forms which are compared to "the vague potentiality of cosmogenesis". In this view, existence is intended "not as an imperfect projection of perfect Ideas but, on the contrary, as a 'theater of reactions' in which Ideas develop" (72). Peirce's Cosmology, which Ibri calls a "strange evolutionary Platonism", besides providing the ontological ground of categories, shows as a logical consequence the "predominance of thirdness over existence" (73), which will be realized in "the infinitely distant future" (EP 1.297). The place of Cosmology, and more generally Metaphysics, in Peirce's pragmatism is developed in chapter 6, which continues to focus on the outcome of the relationship between potency and act as already explored in the previous chapter.  According to the architecture of subject-object linking shown in the various aspects of Peirce's philosophy, Ibri proposes to liberate Pragmatism from overly restrictive epistemic boundaries and to understand it more broadly, according to its metaphysical tone. In his words:

Pragmatism, in its metaphysical hue, represents the relation between firstness and thirdness, and both with the existential factuality of secondness. Based on these considerations, it seems possible to re-enunciate the maxim of the doctrine, no longer through the prism of the determination of the meaning that impregnates the concepts in their positivity, but rather under the perspective of the determination of the reality of general continuous entities. (89)

After over two decades, this new updated and integrated edition can also be read from a historical perspective which helps to foreground at least three particularly significant aspects of Ibri's theoretical view. First, as mentioned, the importance of thinking synthetically remains a key interpretative conception in Peirce's contemporary studies; second, this book offers a still relevant and suggestive reading of the influence of evolutionary theories for the philosophical genesis of pragmatism; and third, there the historical significance of Ibri's rehabilitation of the term "metaphysics" in the past and present mainstream of analytic philosophy of language. All these achievements are still valuable today in a cultural and political world which has become an increasingly fragmented landscape. In the light of what Ibri indicates as a virtuous philosophical praxis, this book is an invitation to a never-ending heuristic reexamination of our philosophical understanding of experience. The author seems to propose it as a fruitful way to develop integrated ways of thinking to confront contemporary challenges within our always renewing social and historical contexts.