2017.11.28

Paul A. Kottman

Love as Human Freedom

Paul A. Kottman, Love as Human Freedom, Stanford University Press, 2017, 214 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781503602274.

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, University of York/The Graduate Center CUNY


"Sooner or later," the hero of Robert Musil's The Man without Qualities muses to his sister Agathe, "there will be an era of simple unassuming sexual comradeship, when boy and girl will stand, reconciled and uncomprehending, gazing at an ancient heap of broken clockwork springs that was once what made Man and Woman tick" [1]

This book argues that we are getting there, or at least that many of the preconditions of getting there have been satisfied. "I will offer," Kottman states in the Prologue, "an account of lovemaking as a distinct world-historical achievement, one that can help us to explain enormous socio-historical shifts, from the increasing social authority of love-based commitments to the erosion of a gender-based division of labor" (9). His argument is roundabout, insofar as much of the book is taken up with the analysis of romantic tragedies ending in the deaths of one or both of the protagonists, and insofar as it is the socio-economic shifts that seem to do the explaining rather than vice-versa. The book is divided into two main sections (Parts II and III). The first discusses love and loss, especially loss of a love to death, in literary texts, including the myth of Pyramus and Thisbe and the drama of Romeo and Juliet. Later the cases of Othello, Emma Bovary and Anna Karenina are explored. Part III presents the thesis that in Western culture from Plato to the present sexual activity has undergone a process of detachment, from reproductive intentions and the domination of women by men, and a corresponding process of attachment, to what the author calls "lovemaking." By this, Kottman means sex reflecting reciprocal passionate engagement with another person and love-based commitments: social institutions and laws that assume marriage and the formation of families based on erotic love. The two sections are essentially independent, except that both make use of literary texts.

Physiological phenomena such as menstruation, miscarriage and multiple births, Kottman alleges, did not make sense to early humans, who had to discover the concept of the fertile female with her special powers and vulnerabilities, and to learn the particular activities that could and could not induce pregnancy, with such knowledge leading to the exercise of power and domination by males. Citing the Platonic corpus, he argues that sexual relations with women in ancient Greece were seen as necessary but vulgar and awarded neither philosophical nor emotionally significant status, unlike the allegedly more noble and compelling relations between boys and men. As I understand the argument, population control implied the domination of women as breeders. The state needed citizens, soldiers, and workers, and aristocratic men needed heirs -- but not too many. This utilitarian image was incompatible with that of genuine reciprocity, self-revelation, and intimacy in marital and extramarital relationships. The misogyny of most philosophical texts (not to mention religious texts) swamped competing ideation, and inevitably limited and distorted love, especially love within the context of marriage.

The past 2500 years, Kottman maintains, have detached heterosexual activity from its tight connection to reproduction, enabling it to become a highly valuable and valued form of expression of freedom and individuality. This change was announced, as has been argued many times before, by the appearance (in Western culture, the transmission from pre-Islamic Arab sources) of new models, and by the Reformation's rejection of the cult of priestly celibacy and antifeminism. The courtly love movement in the medieval period upset the conceptual assignment of freedom to men in general and the denial of choice to women in general. The male lover sang and wrote of himself as the servant of the beloved, who exceeded him in status and power and lamented her inaccessibility and indifference. Reproductive intentions were not part of the story.

Kottman goes on to argue that the detachment of sex from reproduction has accelerated in the last hundred years with the availability of contraception and abortion, the celebration of homosexual love and marriage, and with the release of women from confinement in the household as homemakers and childrearers. He denies that humans have finally worked out the moral facts about how men and women may or ought to relate to one another; rather, in his view, there is a documentable movement towards a form of liberation that is not narrowly sexual, but reinforcing of emotional and social autonomy.

Although Kottman regards love as freedom as a human potential rather than a pure invention, readers will recognise echoes of Denis de Rougement's views about the courtly tradition, Michel Foucault's view that women only became truly interesting as erotic subjects in the 18th century, and Hegel's view that Spirit unfolds, reveals, and discovers itself in historical time. The ideal Kottman suggests we have arrived at resembles Anthony Giddens's definition of the "pure" relationship as one in which "a social relation is entered into for its own sake, for what can be derived by each person from a sustained association with another; and which is continued only insofar as it is thought by both parties to deliver enough satisfactions for each individual to stay within it."[2]

The exploration of these two themes, the loss of love in literary texts and the historical progress of relations between men and women, is welcome. In his attention to the ancients, Kottman is on firm ground insofar as legal historians and historians of culture have detailed the regulations and practices, from infanticide, sexual use of slaves, and forced sodomy, to the claustration of women, aimed at providing the right number and kind of persons in the ancient city state. The methodology of the book raises, however, many questions, as do its conclusions.

First, in Part II and elsewhere, readers will find the interpretations of literary works to be so original that they are hard to understand, let alone to accept. For example, the author argues that Othello is frenzied not by Desdemona's presumed betrayal but by her passivity and inability to reciprocate his agential passion (137), and that the sword between Tristan and Iseult was employed as a contraceptive device at "certain times of the month" (123). In other cases, the reader may be held up by language as well as thought, as when, in criticizing de Rougemont's thesis that love and adultery, or love and other transgressive conditions, are deeply linked, Kottman says that the troubadour tradition emerged when "sexual practices had finally been cultivated, over time, to the point where sexual activity itself had become clamorously unintelligible as either the manifestation of base appetite or as institutional domination (as in traditional marriage)" (126).

But unintelligible to whom? And why should we believe that love and sexual activity indifferent to the reproductive and economic functions of women in one's society emerged in life, as well as in literature, only in the medieval period? Despite the ubiquity of arranged marriage as an old and widespread practice, romantic love between equals or between unequal individuals who become equals is a human universal with evolutionary significance.[3] It appears in most hunter-gatherer cultures and in archaic oral traditions of song and story. It can be seen in Old Testament and Greek accounts of being suddenly smitten by beauty and in accounts of devotional and possessive behavior: Boaz and Ruth, Jacob and Rachel, Dido and Aeneas, Achilles and Briseis; in Homer, Catullus, Sappho, Lucretius, and, despite his cynical stance, in Ovid. Clearly, ancient men did develop fascinations, obsessions, and passions for particular women, and vice-versa, that were either courtly or reciprocal, though usually realised in a premarital or nonmarital context. Despite proclamations and regulations, there were intervals of deregulation and acceptance of marriage in the Catholic clergy. Priests throughout history have had domestic partners whom they loved.

One might argue in Kottman's favor that these sources do not, for the most part, enlighten us on the theme of love as freedom. When given voice, they usually concern the "bonds of love," as experienced in unrequited or conflict-generating love. Martin Luther's overt doting behaviour and his much-cited arguments for clerical marriage were more significant and influential than priestly customs because they constituted public, multiply reproduced philosophical statements explaining and asserting the value of the pure relationship.

A theme of Kottman's which this reviewer was led to wonder about is "making sense." He says that:

Certain social domains -- like gender -- are inextricably linked, not just to power structures, or 'disciplining regimes,' but to fundamental ways in which we have tried to make our lives intelligible . . . I am proposing that we see love as just such a fundamental sense-making practice. (15)

If the erotic confusion of budding relationships is succeeded by requited love, this can bring a sense of order and everything falling at last into place. As John Lennon sings, "For the first time in my life . . . Everything is clear in my mind." But surely this is a feeling of things making sense to the individual, not a collective epistemological achievement. Collectively, the social and technological innovations of modernity seem to have issued in far more confusion and distress in our society over feelings and practices than existed in earlier times.

The analytical portions of this volume would accordingly benefit from a sharper distinction between literary history and actual social history as it can be obtained from archives (diaries, court and municipal records), with some justification offered for concentrating on the former alone. It also would benefit from more explicit attention to the co-existence of anti-love moral philosophy mandating rational control and cost-benefit calculation with myth, poetry, and the novel.

Moral philosophy from Plato to Kant raised warning flags against women, inserted their allure into a general theory of the passions, and recommended the prevention of love, since there is no cure. Literature has always compensated for this one-sidedness. It correctly identifies requited love as the greatest single source of human happiness and celebrates the loss of control and heedlessness, whilst admitting their consequences in social punishment and personal anguish.

All of the stories discussed by Kottman end badly for the lovers. In literature, death (in plot terms always caused by some kind of silly mix-up) occurs necessarily because there is no way forward for these people, given who they are and the society they live in, and Kottman points out that the question "Was it worth it?" is always asked or implicitly asked of any love affair, actual or fictional, that comes to an end. The novel of adultery and the novel of renunciation of the 19th and early 20th centuries concede that what philosophy says about consequences is correct. Nevertheless, they lodge a protest against social punishment and the existence of conventional barriers that keep people apart. Freud's claim that such stories permit vicarious gratification, while enclosing it for safety in a pro-society message with death or lifelong haunting the punishment delivered, needs addressing in this connection.

Turning from literature to the real world, it is important to note against an exaggerated, though still relevant, historicism that there are some questionable assumptions in the notion of an evolution in human mentality accompanying changes in institutional frameworks. Is love freedom in the contemporary world? Surprisingly, Kottman does not address Giddens's claim that contemporary "pure love," existing outside the rigid frameworks prescribing the involvement of kin in partner choice, obligatory marriage, clear expectation of parenthood, difficulty of divorce, and sexual division of labour, has provided psychic benefits in the form of enhanced relationship satisfaction, whilst imposing the heavy costs of "ontological anxiety" in the form of constant self-scrutiny, exhausting monitoring of the relationship for possible cracks and flaws, and addiction to drugs and alcohol.[4] Love as freedom may impose its own forms of bondage.

An article by Gross and Simmons[5] proposed to test these hypotheses, concluding that the dire effects of pure love predicted by Giddens failed to occur, while the beneficial effects were realised. People in these relationships were indeed very happy, and the data would seem to strengthen Kottman's case. However, an interesting feature of this study was the very small number in the random sample of adult heterosexual relationships that qualified as pure love and that scored highly on measures of the sharing of household tasks: only 3.3 % in a sample size of about 2000. Apparently, such pure love relationships are rare, leading to the supposition that the stresses of ontological anxiety and perhaps addictions fostered by failed attempts to form pure love relationships had eliminated many potential pairs before they could be addressed in a survey. It just isn't, for the most part, happening.

So, if love as freedom is an ideal, and if it works well when it works, how can more people get there? In a follow-on analysis to Giddens's account of cultural change, the sociologist Eva Illouz[6] has argued that the separation of sex from the founding of a family and the opening up of marriage markets to individual choice have in fact enhanced male dominance to the profound detriment of modern women's moral confidence and self-respect. In previous centuries, she argues, men wanted and needed wives as much or more than women needed and wanted husbands. In middle- and upper-class circles, potential partners on both sides were filtered through exclusion criteria of class, income, and deportment. Such filters applied, women's and men's choices were governed by intuitive attraction to a certain body and moral character-testing involving close observation by wary kith and kin. Despite the rigidity of the system of lifelong monogamous expectations, partner choices were made without extensive first-hand knowledge of the other person. And women did not admit to an attraction until a definite proposal had been offered by a man.

Today, it is women who court, and men who are coy. Instead of taking up quills and lutes and offering potions, women adorn themselves and seek and purchase strategic advice of doubtful value for securing "commitment." Freedom, as Giddens observed, is freedom to just check out, with or without an explanation, and this, and the threat of it, remains an overwhelmingly male prerogative and a brand new source of domination. In the unattached population, men receive validation of their worth through work, the esteem of other men, and through sexual conquest. Women by and large do not. What Illouz calls the "ecology" (roughly the demographics -- a longer active interval for men in the field of sexual competition) and the "architecture of choice" (in the internet age largely based on "sexiness" estimated from arrays of thumbnail photos and confirmed by follow up behavior) have left women in a demeaning position. Illouz makes a plea for renewed attention to sexual ethics, arguing that the current resources of feminism, focussed on a rejection of heteronormativity and the intensive regulation of the workplace, fail to address the problems of male advantage in satisfying desires and female suffering in our liberated times. She implies that this pattern can be interrupted only if women can achieve sufficient financial resources to be able to have children when they want to, and only if they can obtain social status and regard from sources other than an intimate partner.

If Illouz is correct, reproduction, economics, and old-fashioned character expectations have to come back into the picture if men and women are to achieve greater equality and satisfaction in their intimate relationships. Further, as the flood of recent revelations regarding workplace abuse and exploitation indicates, we need a new understanding of how men and women can work together in non-intimate relationships, and how they can share the co-operative surplus in such a way as to limit male domination in the search for intimate companionship.

I am glad to have read this book even without having understood every word of it or agreed with all of it. It will, as publishers like to say, "stimulate controversy." We can be grateful to Paul Kottman for investigating this territory as a philosopher with an extensive knowledge of literary texts, for stating his optimism, and for signposting many interesting avenues for further exploration. The endnotes add considerably to the text; they are clear and pertinent and display a formidable acquaintance with a range of literary and philosophical sources. The index, by contrast, appears to have been prepared by a robot and lacks human insight into what a human being would actually want to look up.


[1] Robert Musil, The Man without Qualities, 3 vols., tr. Eithne Wilkins and Ernst Kaiser, Secker and Warburg, 1960, III: 28; 328.

[2] Anthony Giddens, The Transformation of Intimacy: Sexuality, Love and Eroticism in Modern Societies, Stanford, Stanford University Press, 1992, p. 58.

[3] Garth J. O. Fletcher, Jeffry A. Simpson, Lorne Campbell, and Nickola C. Overall, 'Pair Bonding, Romantic Love, and Evolution: The Curious Case of Homo sapiens,' Perspectives on Psychological Science, 2015, Vol. 10(1): 20-36.

[4] Giddens, Transformation, pp. 74-6.

[5] Neil Gross and Solon Simmons, 'Intimacy as a Double-Edged Phenomenon? An Empirical Test of Giddens' Social Forces, December 2002, 81(2):531-555

[6] Eva Illouz, Why Love Hurts: A Sociologcal Explanation, Polity, 2013.