Conor McHugh, Jonathan Way, and Daniel Whiting (eds.)


Conor McHugh, Jonathan Way, and Daniel Whiting (eds.), Metaepistemology, Oxford University Press, 2018, 216pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198805366.

Reviewed by Brian Hedden, University of Sydney

Metaepistemology is an exciting field that seems to have undergone rapid and accelerating growth in the past few years. The arrival of this timely anthology of original essays, along with another soon-to-be published anthology (Kyriacou and McKenna 2019), further solidifies the importance of this field.

As the name suggests, metaepistemology stands to epistemology as metaethics stands to ethics. It concerns questions about the nature of epistemic facts and judgments and the roles they play in our agency. Like metaethics, metaepistemology is a broad field. I think we can distinguish at least three strands of research in the field. The first strand focuses on the debate over realism and anti-realism in epistemology. The second strand tries to take theses about the roles or purposes of epistemic language and use them to generate arguments for first-order epistemological theses. And the third is a sort of miscellaneous strand which analyses or otherwise theorises about epistemic concepts in a distinctive (but hard to pin down) 'meta' fashion, but which is not primarily concerned with either the realism/anti-realism debate or with deriving first-order epistemological consequences.

The first strand is the most well-represented in this anthology, with six chapters primarily focused on realism and anti-realism (and related debates) in epistemology, namely the articles by Kristoffer Ahlstrom-Vij, Terence Cuneo and Christos Kyriacou, Anandi Hattiangadi, Hille Paakkunainen, Jonas Olson, and Michael Ridge. The issue of realism versus anti-realism in epistemology is interesting and important in its own right, but it is also important for metaethics. Arguably, we should expect whatever theory is true of ethics -- reductive realism, expressivism, quasi-realism, or what have you -- to also be true of epistemology; so says the 'Parity Premise' first endorsed by Cuneo (2007). If the Parity Premise is correct, then we can test the plausibility of a given metaethical theory by seeing whether it would be plausible when applied to epistemic claims, and vice versa.

In this anthology, Cuneo and Kyriacou (Ch. 2) defend the Parity Premise against an objection from Christopher Heathwood (2009), who argues that epistemic claims, unlike ethical ones, can plausibly be reduced to descriptive claims, for instance claims about probability or reliability. Olson (Ch. 6) rejects the Parity Premise, arguing that epistemic reasons may not be 'irreducibly normative' but instead 'functionally normative,' whereby their normativity derives from the characteristic functions of belief in helping us navigate the world. In this way, norms for belief are a bit like norms for what makes a good heart or hypothalamus (to use Olson's examples). A belief not based on evidence, say, would be defective in the sense that failure to be based on good evidence generally prevents beliefs from playing their characteristic function well.

The other chapters I've associated with this first strand do not specifically concern the Parity Principle. Ahlstrom-Vij (Ch. 1) objects to epistemic realism on the grounds that it predicts far more convergence among epistemologists than we in fact observe. I found this objection uncompelling, for it's not clear just how much convergence we should expect if epistemic realism is true, and in any case there is considerable convergence among epistemologists on many things, even if they often disagree on the level of grand theories. For instance, a majority of epistemologists now agree that knowledge is not justified true belief, that the probabilistic principle of indifference is false, and that having a justified belief does not require being able to defend that belief dialectically against all comers. It is not clear why realism would predict significantly more convergence than this. Hattiangadi (Ch. 5) critiques various ways of making sense of disagreement about logic (e.g., the disagreement between classical and non-classical logicians) on the assumption that logic is normative, such that judgments about validity are normative judgments (say, about which inferences are justified). Paakkunainen (Ch. 7) argues against the distinction between epistemic reasons that are 'genuinely normative' and ones that aren't, thereby undercutting a common response to counterexamples to instrumentalist conceptions of epistemic reasons on which you have epistemic reasons to have some belief just in case this belief would serve some practical or cognitive goal of yours. This is important for the debate between realists and anti-realists since some theorists are drawn to an instrumentalist conception of epistemology on the grounds that it allows for a realist yet naturalist-friendly view of epistemology. Finally, Ridge (Ch. 8) defends extending his previously developed 'ecumenical expressivism' to the epistemic realm.

The second strand of metaepistemology has its eye on debates in first-order epistemology. The idea is to focus on why creatures like us would have a need or use for epistemic language, and then to see how views about the role or purposes of epistemic thought and talk might have implications for first-order debates in epistemology. This strand traces back to Edward Craig's 1990 book Knowledge and the State of Nature and has more recently been taken up in papers by Sinan Dogramaci, Karl Schafer, Miriam Schoenfield, Daniel Greco, Sophie Horowitz, and myself, and in a couple of recent books: Michael Hannon's monograph What's the Point of Knowledge: A Function-First Epistemology and David Henderson and John Greco's edited volume Epistemic Evaluation: Purposeful Epistemology.

This is the strand that most interests me as an epistemologist. But unfortunately, it is much less well-represented in this anthology. Still, there are two excellent chapters that I would put in this category. In Chapter 4, Greco considers the 'autonomy thesis,' which states that what position we adopt in metaethics or metaepistemology puts no constraints on what position we adopt in first-order normative ethics or epistemology. (Since he's also considering the realism/anti-realism debate, his chapter is also associated with the first strand.) It is a widely-held thesis in metaethics, but Greco rejects it in the metaepistemological case, and ultimately in metaethics too. He argues for the plausibility of a kind of judgment internalism in epistemology, on which judging that it's rational to believe some proposition necessarily carries with it some motivation or inclination toward believing it, and indeed that this might be part of the point or function of epistemic claims. And he argues that this judgment internalism supports a position in the first-order debate about so-called 'level-bridging' principles in epistemology. In particular, he argues that it supports the principle that if it's rational for you to believe that it's rational for you to believe that P, then it's rational for you to believe that P. This chapter was one of the main highlights of the book for me.

In Chapter 10, Schafer builds on his earlier work defending the idea that epistemic thought and talk serves to express plans for what to believe in certain contingencies. For instance, claiming that it is irrational to believe in miracles even in the face of seemingly convincing testimony serves in part to express a plan not to believe in miracles even in that situation, and perhaps also to invite one's interlocuters to do the same. This 'planning expressivism' derives from Allan Gibbard's Thinking How to Live, and many of the aforementioned 'second strand' epistemologists have followed Schafer in applying it to metaepistemology.

Schafer (2014) previously argued that this plan-based conception of the role of epistemic thought and talk supports internalism about justification. The idea is that it is irrational to plan to do or believe something in one set of circumstances but not in another if you cannot first-personally distinguish the first set of circumstances from the second. But externalism says that a belief can be justified in one set of circumstances but not in another, even though the two sets of circumstances are not distinguishable from the first-person perspective.

In this paper, Schafer responds to an objection from Schoenfield (2015), who notes that sometimes it seems rational to plan to do something in a given set of circumstances even though you cannot always tell whether those circumstances obtain. For instance, it can be rational to plan to buy more milk when there's none in the fridge even though you cannot always distinguish between circumstances in which there is or isn't any milk in the fridge (there could be an evil demon feeding you appearances as of an empty fridge). Schoenfield goes on to give a different plan-based argument for internalism.

In response, Schafer adds some nuance to his previous argument. The key is to distinguish between those plans with an implicit ceteris paribus clause and those without. He thinks that whenever it's rational to plan to do one thing in one set of circumstances but not in another, the plan always has an implicit ceteris paribus or 'provided things are normal' clause; else the plan would be irrational. For instance, it is rational to plan to buy more milk only when there's none in the fridge ceteris paribus, where the ceteris paribus clause is not satisfied in evil demon scenarios.

I found Schafer's response largely convincing. But I worry about his claim at the end that he can still embrace the anti-Cartesian thesis that there are no 'transparent' conditions, not even mental ones, where a condition is transparent just in case we are always in a position to know whether or not it obtains. Suppose that in addition to all our ceteris paribus plans, we also have some fully fleshed-out plans so specific that they don't involve any ceteris paribus conditions (think of Gibbard's hyperplans). Given Schafer's commitments, these plans would have to refer only to circumstances such that we are always in a position to distinguish cases where they obtain from cases where they don't.

Doesn't that mean those circumstances would have to be cashed out in terms of transparent conditions? Schafer says no, since on his conception of distinguishability, being able to distinguish between two possibilities doesn't mean being in a position to know which one obtains. But he doesn't tell us quite what it does mean. Is it a matter of being in a position to have a true belief about which one obtains? That is too weak, since one is always in a position to have a true belief about anything; guessing correctly would suffice. What about being in a position to have a justified true belief about which one obtains? That would be circular in this context, since Schafer is trying to argue for a position about what justification requires. Perhaps distinguishability could be cashed out in more behavioural terms having to do with differential responsiveness, or tending to behave differently in the two circumstances. Something like this could be on the right track, but there are still problems to be addressed. For instance, would one have to always (or instead usually, or just sometimes) behave differently in the two circumstances in order for them to count as distinguishable? In any case, this is something I'd like to hear more about, given how large anti-Cartesianism looms in the debate between internalism and externalism.

The third strand concerns other sorts of analyses of epistemic concepts. Three chapters fall into this somewhat miscellaneous strand. Davide Fassio and Anne Meylan (Ch. 3) look at how 'buck-passing accounts' of ethical concepts could be extended to epistemic ones, where a buck-passing account cashes out what it is to have the property referred to by some normative concept in terms of reasons to have certain fitting responses. For instance, what it is for something to be wrong is for it to have other properties which constitute reasons not to perform it and/or to blame others for doing so. Debbie Roberts (Ch. 9) compellingly defends the existence of thick concepts in epistemology against a variety of objections. And Mark Schroeder (Ch. 11) concludes the book with a fascinating argument that knowing is believing well on both subjective and objective dimensions. His argument has implications for a variety of 'common factor' disputes, for instance the debate in ethics over whether morally right action is more fundamental than morally worthy action, such that the latter is just acting rightly plus some further factor, or whether morally worthy action is more fundamental, with moral rightness being a mere 'modal shadow' of morally worthy action.

Despite its many good features, I found myself occasionally disappointed by this anthology. I thought there were clear objections to key moves in some of the papers and that others were a bit niche. And a couple of the articles could be characterised as responses to responses. As noted, the article by Cuneo and Kyriacou is largely a response to Heathwood's review of Cuneo's book, and the article by Schafer is largely a response to a paper of Schoenfield's that critically discusses his 2014 paper. This is no complaint about the articles themselves; as I said, I found them illuminating and largely convincing. But I would have liked the anthology to perhaps have opened up more new areas for future research.

The anthology also doesn't flow as well as it could, at least when one reads it cover to cover. For instance, there are two chapters on the Parity Premise, but they're separated by three chapters on other issues. And there are two chapters falling in what I called the second strand, but they're separated by five intervening chapters. Puzzling about this, I looked back at the table of contents and realised that the chapters are ordered by authors' last names. Perhaps this is the norm with some anthologies, but I think the cover to cover reading experience could be improved by re-ordering the chapters.

Nonetheless, there is a lot to learn from this anthology, and it will make a deserved impact on a range of debates in metaepistemology.


Craig, Edward. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature. New York: Oxford University Press.

Cuneo, Terence. 2007. The Normative Web. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Gibbard, Allan. 2003. Thinking How to Live. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Hannon, Michael. 2019. What's the Point of Knowledge? A Function-First Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.

Heathwood, Christopher. 2009. 'Moral and Epistemic Open-Question Arguments.' Philosophical Books 50 (2): 83-98.

Henderson, David and John Greco. 2015. Epistemic Evaluation: Purposeful Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.

Kyriacou, Christos and Robin McKenna. 2018. Metaepistemology: Realism and Anti-Realism. Palgrave Macmillan.

Schafer, Karl. 2014. 'Doxastic Planning and Epistemic Internalism.' Synthese 191 (12): 2571-91.

Schoenfield, Miriam. 2015. 'Internalism without Luminosity.' Philosophical Issue 25 (1): 252-72.