2019.07.26

Nolen Gertz

Nihilism and Technology

Nolen Gertz, Nihilism and Technology, Rowman and Littlefield, 2018, 226pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781786607034.

Reviewed by John P. Sullins, Sonoma State University


It is very likely that you have been brought to this review through your use of information technologies. In other words, your interaction with the device before you. The process of typing and clicking that led you here, however, is not merely an innocent search for information according to Nolen Gertz. Instead, he argues that the very process that brought you to read this review is itself an expression of nihilism. Gertz challenges his readers to confront and overcome the nihilism inherent in information technologies.

Gertz's book relies heavily on the philosophy of Friedrich Nietzsche to argue its thesis: technologies, particularly information technologies, have become our main method of distraction from the loss of meaning in our lives that Nietzsche argues has resulted from the triumph of nihilism. Gertz describes (chapter 1) how Nietzsche observed developing trends in the nineteenth century including self-hypnosis, mechanical activity, petty pleasures, herd instinct, and orgies of feeling. Nietzsche argued that these trends were ways in which his culture was sidestepping the seismic shifting of values that had been brought about by, what Nietzsche termed, "the death of God," or our modern inability to find any meaning in traditional values. Gertz extends this critique into our own century by arguing that, while we now have better science and technology, we are still deeply locked into these same coping strategies; in some ways these trends have even intensified (chapter 2). Given the heavy dependence on Nietzsche, readers who find this style of philosophy without merit will not enjoy this book. But for those who enjoy this style of philosophy, this book is an interesting application of Nietzsche to the digital world. There is also a quick discussion of how some of the philosophers who were inspired by Nietzsche turned their attention to technology as deserving of philosophical inquiry (chapter 3).

Gertz makes the claim that Nietzsche's concept of self-hypnosis is now attained through "techno-hypnosis," which is found in activities like binge-watching on streaming technologies like Netflix, YouTube, etc. (chapter 4). The punch card dictated mechanical activity of workers of the past has evolved during this century into the information technology form of "data driven activity," such as the dehumanized ununionized Amazon warehouse workersand Uber drivers at work, and Fitbit or Apple Watch motivated workouts in our spare time (chapter 5). The petty pleasures of the past are now experienced in what Gertz calls "pleasure economics," where platforms like Kickstarter are used to experience the self-satisfaction of helping the needy just as a rich patron might have done in the past. However, we can all participate in this now by doling out a few easy-to-spend payments of a couple hundred dollars to those few we find worthy among the many requesting help online (chapter 6). Social media giants such as Facebook tap into the Nietzschean herd instinct to create a dangerous high-tech social monster that Gertz identifies as "herd networking" (chapter 7). And finally, the nineteenth century orgies of feeling and popular uprisings are now greatly amplified through "orgies of clicking" that give modern users of information technologies the power to destroy lives and alter the course of history, place a troll in office, all through the mere act of expressing rage and emotion online via likes and reposts (chapter 8).

Gertz argues that the great changes we are experiencing in our societies are not absolutely new, instead these are accelerations of the Nietzschean nineteenth century nihilistic tendencies to a new fever pitch, expressed most glaringly in the philosophy of Silicon Valley -- transhumanism (chapter 2.4). In these sections Gertz is at his best arguing that the transhumanism one can overhear from some enfant terrible in the genius bar is not as new, ultra-hip, and paradigm shifting as its proponents think. Gertz is setting forth for himself the task of developing his own philosophy of technology heavily influenced by Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger, Jacques Ellul, along with more contemporary thinkers such as Don Idhe to create what he calls nihilism-technology relations (45-55). The result of which will hopefully lead to a better outcome than was experienced with the Death-of-God, which has only led to the rise of Google-as-God. Gertz hopes for an active nihilism as something which would be more appropriate for Silicon Valley iconoclasts, whom he hopes will one day proudly proclaim that Google is dead, and we have killed it.

Nietzsche is a philosopher who is not afraid of eliciting strong emotion, so this book will have you cheering at some moments and make you want to punch your screen (or book) at others. Gertz takes his readers on a journey (chapters 4-8) that begins by critiquing information technologies and technologists, whom he argues have become the new ascetic priests of our time. This initial critique is a fun lampooning of the mega-rich technologists who are preaching techno-utopian dreams. The new techno-ascetic purpose is to point out our all-too-human weaknesses and engender a self-loathing based on the realization of our many failings. These people then promise that we can transcend all our weaknesses via wondrous apps and devices. Are you wracked by an existential dread you are desperate to numb? There is an app for that, and it is called Pokémon Go. Gertz presents five chapters (4-8) in which he deftly critiques the desire to momentarily distract our nihilism, or our inability to live our own lives and instead fall into the arms of technologies willing to do the hard work of life for us: suggesting what we should read, what we should watch, who we should be friends with, who to connect with in business, and even with whom we should hook up with. Yet ultimately, it is the reader herself that must realize that in the midst of this critique is the uncomfortable realization of her own nihilistic complicity in the creation of these apps. Nihilistic apps and devices feed the nihilistic desires of their users. In each of these chapters Gertz pleads that if we would only confront our nihilism and our unmooring from traditional values head on, then we would not be such ready victims for the new techno-utopians who have taken over from the ascetic priests of the past.

Several critical questions that this book leaves the reader with are worth mentioning. It is not clear why Gertz feels he must remain faithful to a Nietzschean concept of nihilism, rather than elucidating his own conception of a nihilism more attuned to our present time. Much of the same work could have been more deftly presented if Gertz had built on the concept of nihilism rather than working to fit Nietzsche's ideas into every niche where they might not always be readily applicable. Related to this is the worry that the book merely plays with the ideas of Nietzsche and is not a through explication of his philosophy. This has the potential for possibly leading uncritical or new readers of Nietzsche astray as they begin their studies. One can easily imagine that Nietzsche scholars will be unlikely to have a charitable impression of this book due to its lack of a through reference to established Nietzsche scholarship. Yet, if one is to play more or less loosely with the works of a past philosopher, then Nietzsche is one of the best with which to do so. His work is defiantly and self-consciously an act of rebellion against traditional meaning and the more conservative philosophy of his time. Claiming that there is a true interpretation of Nietzsche would be to profoundly miss the point and fall for the many ironic traps that Nietzsche sets for his readers. Thus, those who are not Nietzsche scholars with an axe to grind are less likely to care about nitpicking Gertz's adherence, or lack thereof, to the accepted scholarship regarding the meaning of nihilism in Nietzsche's works. Gertz does address the appropriate primary works of Nietzsch. He is offering his own interpretation of the work, and readers should be aware of that.

Gertz sets up his arguments by explaining earlier attempts at the philosophy of technology (chapter 3). Important works such as those of Heidegger and Ellul are built into the foundation of Gertz's work. Both of these theories share the view that technology is an ontological force that resists or is beyond human control. For them technology consists of more than just technologies, but a technique that rapidly transforms all being, including human being, into a new, possibly less valuable form. However, Gertz follows the line of thought that has evolved from these sources through Idhe, that seeks to alter this idea a bit and show where humans have some control in deciding their relationship to technology (chapter 3).

By the end of the book, Gertz briefly engages with contemporary philosophers of technology, such as Luciano Floridi, Peter-Paul Verbeek, and Shannon Vallor, but in a strange move he equates them with more techno-utopian thinkers such as Kevin Warwick, Ray Kurzweil, and Nick Bostrum (208-212). This line of reasoning is too quick and borders on straw-person arguments. There are plenty of distinctions between the first three thinkers that would make it difficult to categorize their philosophies as being deeply similar, much less to the last three techno-utopian and transhumanist thinkers. Still, one major theory that Floridi, Vallor, and Verbeek do acknowledge is that we should theorize not about some impersonal force we might name Technology with a capital "T" that somehow destroys (or transcends) humanity through its totalizing power. Instead, they argue that we should think about many separate technologies that form an essential part of what it means to be human. Technology does not control us; we are fundamentally constituted from technology, so we are in control of it in the same way we control ourselves. However, Floridi, Vallor, and Verbeek each has his or her own take on just how robust that control can be, or what form it can take. In addition, each technology or technical system needs to be analyzed and defended or rejected according to its individual ability to help in human flourishing and our actualization as more ethical beings. Nevertheless, Gertz is correct in claiming that Nietzsche may yet be an effective tool in building on these arguments in contemporary philosophy of technology. One quick example: Vallor addresses Nietzsche in numerous places in her book, Technology and the Virtues (2016). At the end of it as she critiques transhumanism she argues:

Consider Nietzsche's warning once more. We hear much from transhumanists about what they want to free us from: sickness, aging, death; the limitations of our bodily form; the tyrannies of entropy, space, and time. But do we hear as clearly what they want to free us for? (p. 241)

I would argue that this shows a distinct allied appeal to that of Gertz. At the end of the book (spoiler alert), Gertz concludes:

Passive nihilism has led us to see in technologies a way to become better humans, humans who are more productive and who are -- or at least should be -- happier while being productive. But passive nihilism is also leading us to see in technologies a way to become sicker humans, humans who are trapped in an endless cycle of never being satisfied with how much "better" we have become. In other words, passive nihilism is leading us toward active nihilism, toward being able to question if we know what "better" means . . . " (212)

While Gertz's attempt to break from the pack of contemporary philosophy of technology is too quick and unconvincing, his critique of key modern technologies that impact the daily lives of billions is much more interesting. It is this that recommends the book. Even if the reader is not necessarily convinced that Nietzschean nihilism is at work in modern technology, Gertz makes the case that some form or nihilism is at play and that it is worth confronting.

REFERENCES

Vallor, Shannon. 2016. Technology and the Virtues: A Philosophical Guide to a Future Worth Wanting. Oxford University Press.