2019.03.15

Fabrice Correia and Sven Rosenkranz

Nothing to Come: A Defence of the Growing Block Theory of Time

Fabrice Correia and Sven Rosenkranz, Nothing to Come: A Defence of the Growing Block Theory of Time, Springer, 2018, 197pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319787039.

Reviewed by Ulrich Meyer, Colgate University


In this carefully argued book, Fabrice Correia and Sven Rosenkranz present a version of the growing block theory that they claim to be immune to the usual objections against this theory of time. I think they are right that their proposal does indeed enjoy such immunity, but I am not sure that their proposal is what other people had in mind when they endorsed the growing block theory.

 

According to the way people usually think of the proposal, the growing block theory claims that past and present are real, but not the future. While all facts about the past are settled, the future is still open. As time goes by, the block of reality grows, with new layers of reality constantly being added to the past. Understood in this way, the growing block theory is one of a range of views in the philosophy of time that claim that the present moment is metaphysically privileged. While every time might describe itself as being present, there is only one time that is right about this.  The objectively present time is the one time that characterizes the edge of the growing block, where the open future turns into the settled past.

 

The standard objections to the growing block theory all focus on this proposed account of presentness. The Epistemic Objection denies that the present is special in the particular way indicated by the growing block theory; the Relativity Objection claims any attempt at singling out the present as metaphysically privileged runs afoul of our best physics. The growing block theory proposed by Correia and Rosenkranz – which I shall call ‘GBT’ – avoids these difficulties by not postulating a property of presentness at all. GBT describes a world of constant creation in which nothing ever gets destroyed. While new things continuously come into existence, GBT claims that nothing ever goes out of existence. That is all there is to GBT. (This is the upshot of the two postulates P1 and P2 on pages 43 and 44 that jointly define GBT.)

 

THE FUTURE

 

GBT is based on a standard propositional tense logic that gets presented in Chapter 1 and Appendix 1. A model for this logic is a set of times equipped with an earlier-than relation < plus some other structure that we need not worry about here. A past-tense claim   (“it was the case that φ”) is then said to be true at a time u just in case the embedded sentence φ is true at some time v such that v<u. Future-tense claims get evaluated in a symmetric manner. A claim of the form   (“it will be the case that φ”) is true at u just in case φ is true at some time v such that u<v.

 

This tense logic postulates no fundamental difference between the past and the future. If we take a model and flip past and future, by changing < to its converse, then we get another model of the same system of tense logic. The system also validates bivalence for future-tense claims. For any sentence φ and any time u in any model, either  or  F¬φ is true at u. If we follow Michael Dummett and identify anti-realism about a subject matter with a failure of bivalence, then this tense logic – and hence GBT – is as realist about the future as it is about the past. 

 

There are systems of tense logic that do not have this feature, and which combine a realist account of the past with an anti-realist account of the future. By opting for a standard system of tense logic in Chapter 1, Correia and Rosenkranz decline these alternative proposals from the outset. The authors say more about this in Chapter 7, where they argue that the only plausible way of making sense of the alleged openness of the future is in terms of indeterministic laws of nature, rather than in terms of a failure of bivalence. I am inclined to agree with them on this point (see my 2016), but I suspect that many growing block theorists will object that this abandons a central tenet of their view: that the present forms the boundary between the settled past and the open future.

 

QUANTIFIED TENSE LOGIC

 

For Correia and Rosenkranz, the asymmetry between past and future can only be captured by adding quantifiers to their system of tense logic. They claim that there is only one sense of ‘everything’ and that this is what their quantifiers express (p. 63) but I am not sure the matter is quite that simple. Similar to the modal case, combining tense operators and quantifiers is a non-trivial matter and there are at least three different ways of setting up a quantified tense logic.

 

One option is to use time-relative quantifiers that have different ranges at different times. At each moment in time, these quantifiers range over what exists then. In this case, we can define a time-relative existence predicate E! in terms of quantification and identity, by regarding E!x as an abbreviation for ∃y y=x. The second option is to adopt untensed quantifiers that always range over the same objects, irrespective of whether these objects exist at the time at which we evaluate the quantifiers. To express time-relative existence claims, we would then need an independent existence predicate that cannot be defined in terms of quantification.

 

A third option is to adopt untensed quantifiers and to retain the definition of E! in terms of quantification and identity. Our quantified tense logic would then entail that everything always exists. In the modal case, this view is advocated by Timothy Williamson (2002), who thinks that all objects exist necessarily. What other theories regard as merely possible objects, Williamson regards as necessary objects that happen to lack almost all properties in the actual world.

 

Correia and Rosenkranz take quantification to be “unrestricted” (p. 13), which might suggest an untensed reading of the quantifiers. But that is not in fact their view. According to clause L8 of their model theory on p. 169, their quantifiers are time-relative. At each time u, the quantifiers range over the domain D(u) of things that exist then.

 

Untensed quantifiers allow us to generate a complete system of quantified tense logic by combining a standard system of propositional tense logic with a standard system of quantificational logic and tensed Barcan formulae. This yields a tense-analogue of the simplest quantified modal logic of Bernard Linsky and Edward Zalta (1994). The logic of time-relative quantifiers is more complicated. These quantifiers require changes to the underlying system of quantificational logic, such as the modified rule of universal instantiation A19 on p. 166. 

 

That they use time-relative quantifiers is not an objection to the view advanced by Correia and Rosenkranz. There are different ways of carving up the logical territory and this is the one they pick. In addition to standard tense operators and time-relative quantifiers, their system also includes an “at” operator that allows us to make claims about what is true at a particular time. The technical details of all this get spelled out in Chapters 2–4 and Appendix A1.

 

Once all of this is in place, GBT can then be characterized as follows. Given any times u and v such that u<v, GBT claims that the domain Du of all objects that exist at the earlier time u is strictly contained in the domain Dv of all the objects that exist at the later time: Du⊂Dv. In other words, the domain of quantification strictly increases over time. At each time, something exists then that has never existed before, and nothing ever goes out of existence.  According to GBT, the future is distinguished from the past as the direction in which the domain of quantification increases.

 

THE EPISTEMIC OBJECTION

 

One objection to the growing block theory is that it would saddle us with two senses of ‘now’. There is the ordinary indexical nowi, tokens of which refer to the time of utterance. But the growing block theory also postulates a metaphysical nowm that picks out the edge of the growing block. The question is how nowi and nowm are related. If the growing block theory is right then there are many tokens of nowi that are stuck inside the block, far from the edge. What guarantees that we are not in this position? How do we know that, right now, the edge of the block is located at this very moment?  That is, how do we know that nowi is nowm? The Epistemic Objection, which was first raised by Craig Bourne and David Braddon-Mitchell, claims that the growing block theory has no plausible answers to these questions.

 

As we learn in Chapter 6, GBT avoids this problem altogether because it does not postulate a metaphysical nowm at all.  GBT describes a world with a constantly increasing domain of quantification, but it does not stipulate the existence of a block of reality with a present edge that marks the border between a real past and an unreal future.  (This is a direct consequence of the standard tense logic that Correia and Rosenkranz adopt in Chapter 1.)

 

THE RELATIVITY OBJECTION

 

If there were a metaphysical nowm then that would allow us to define an absolute notion of simultaneity in terms of co-location on the edge of the growing block. This would risk contradicting the theory of relativity, which is widely thought to reject a notion of absolute simultaneity. By not postulating a metaphysical nowm, GBT avoids this problem as well.  However, Chapter 8 notes that this not the end of the matter. While GBT does not postulate a metaphysical nowm, it does help itself to an absolute temporal order relation <, which is not compatible with relativity theory, either. To overcome this problem, Chapter 9 and Appendix 2 present a way of spelling out the “constant creation” idea behind GBT in relativistic setting.

 

CONCLUSION

 

I think that Correia and Rosenkranz do indeed succeed at the task that they set themselves in the beginning of the book. Their proposal GBT is immune to the standard objections to the growing block theory. I am less sure whether other advocates of the growing block theory will regard it as a defense of their position. They might complain that GBT abandons the very thing that was distinctive about their view: a theory of presentness with a fixed past and an open future.

 

While GBT avoids the problems of other growing block theories, it does run into a new problem of its own making. According to GBT, existence is a one-way street: objects can be created, but no object can ever be destroyed. It is certainly possible for the domain of quantification to strictly increase over time in this way, but that possibility does not appear to be actual. While you were reading this sentence, millions of photons were created, existed for a while, and then went out of existence again. Or at least that is what our physics suggests. Yet if we take this at face value then the actual world is a counter-example to GBT. I wish Correia and Rosenkranz had said a little bit more about how they would deal with this problem. 

 

REFERENCES

 

Linsky, Bernard and Zalta, Edward (1994) “In Defense of the Simplest Quantified Modal Logic” Philosophical Perspectives 8, 431–458.

 

Meyer, Ulrich (2016) “Fatalism as a Metaphysical Thesis” Manuscrito 39, 203­–223.

 

Williamson, Timothy (2002) “Necessary existents” in Anthony O'Hear (ed.) Logic, Thought and Language, Cambridge University Press, 233–251.