Bruce Matthews, who has already contributed to the growing literature on Schelling's work with an excellent translation, The Grounding of Positive Philosophy. The Berlin Lectures (SUNY, 2007), now offers us a book-length analysis of the idea that he claims "animates and informs Schelling's work" (xii). This idea, according to Matthews, is the organic form of philosophy. Two questions shall guide me in assessing this volume: Is the hunt for a fundamental idea in the philosopher disparagingly dubbed by Hegel as the "Proteus of philosophy" a Quixotic search? Does Matthews convincingly show that if there is indeed such a fundamental idea to be found in Schelling's philosophy, that such a fundamental idea is organic form? Before discussing these questions, let me note that a volume on Schelling is always a welcome addition to the literature on German Idealism, as that field can become overwhelmed (indeed, overshadowed) by the likes of Kant and Hegel. Matthews adds Fichte to the bunch of widely represented German Idealists, but on that point, I would disagree, as I think too little attention is paid to Fichte (notwithstanding the valuable work by devoted scholars such as Dan Breazeale, Wayne Martin, Tom Rockmore, and Günter Zoeller that has brought more attention to Fichte's valuable contributions to German Idealism). Fichte remains a philosophical underdog of sorts. In what follows, I will return to some other quibbles with the historical portrait offered by Matthews in his study.
In the six chapters of this tightly argued study, Matthews contrasts Schelling's organic standpoint to modernity's standpoint of the subject. Matthews uses this contrast to argue that Schelling should not be read merely as a bridge between Fichte's subjective idealism and Hegel's absolute idealism, but rather as a thinker who offered "an epistemological structure grounded in the facticity of organic life and actual existence" (p. 171). What Matthews seeks is the reading of Schelling's work that must have been what Schelling intended if his philosophy were "to prove internally cohesive" (p. 11). This reading is moored in what Matthews identifies as the "alpha and omega" of Schelling's philosophy, the idea of freedom, an idea developed via Schelling's organic form of philosophy, with life as the schema for freedom. As Matthews tells us in the opening pages of his work:
Initiated by Descartes, formulated by Kant and perfected by Fichte, the subjective idealism of modernity denies the objective reality and intrinsic value of nature, since as "a product of the I," the world of nature becomes nothing more than a "Gedankending" to be posited by the thinking subject "when needed." According to Schelling, the devaluation of sensuous nature has its roots in modernity's promotion of the thinking human subject to the rank of the absolute, an inflation of the cogito that leads to the vainglorious deification of the human subject at the subsequent cost of what Schelling presciently calls the "annihilation of nature" (p. 2).
According to Matthews, Schelling's reading of the history of philosophy gives us a portrait of the Cartesian cogito or Fichtean ego as offering the clearest examples of the philosophical pathologies of the modern self. Schelling develops his philosophy of nature as a balm against these Cartesian and Fichtean maladies, and Matthews provides us with an impressively detailed account of the arc of Schelling's philosophical development.
Matthews takes us back to the roots of Schelling's views of nature by giving us an account of two rather obscure thinkers who shaped Schelling's early years, Friedrich Christoph Oetinger (1702-1782) and Philipp Matthäus Hahn (1739-1790). The latter is described by Matthews as a "self-proclaimed heterodox prophet whose freethinking led to the censorship of his writing by the Würtenberg Church" and as a "renowned Naturphilosoph" (p. 37). These thinkers shaped for the early Schelling the "epistemological challenge of apprehending the organic unity of reason and knowledge" (p. 68). This historical context does allow us to make greater sense of some of the points developed in Chapter Three, "The Question of Systematic Unity", which presents an analysis of life as the schema for freedom. In this analysis, Matthews makes some enlightening connections between Schelling and Kant, especially with respect to the ways in which Kant's Critique of Judgment shaped Schelling's thought. After making a case for the Kant connection, Matthews turns to the presence of Plato in Schelling's work.
Chapter Four, "The Timaeus Commentary", is dedicated to an account of how Schelling found a fit between Plato and Kant, and hence put the ancients into conversation with the moderns. In this fit between Plato and Kant, Matthews argues, Schelling finds his way to the Urform of all reasoning and to a question that formed the topic of his first philosophical essay, On the Possibility of a Form of Philosophy in General. The Form Essay is the subject of Chapter Five, in which Matthews makes his case that a deeper and more accurate understanding of Schelling's thought will "enrich our understanding of German Idealism" (p. 135).
Important aspects of German Idealism are indeed enriched by Matthews' account of Schelling's philosophical development and by the constellation of thinkers he chooses to guide his reading of Schelling. But one limitation of Matthews' approach is that he completely ignores some of the figures most closely connected to the themes of nature, art, beauty, and mythology, which Matthews rightfully emphasizes. This neglect begins early. Already with the first mention of the so-called "Oldest System Programme of German Idealism" (1796), we are told in a footnote that "Contrary to Pöggler and others who see in this document both the penmanship and brilliance of Hegel, it is clear to those familiar with Hegel and Schelling that only the latter could have developed the ideas expressed in this fragmentary manifesto" (p. 232 n. 57). More reasons for what makes the matter of this text's authorship clear are in order, particularly because it has been argued that Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843), too, was a possible author. And Hölderlin, known for his kinship with the early German Romantics, is a thinker who was deeply concerned with the role of beauty and of mythology in addressing questions of the modern self. Friedrich Schlegel (1772-1829) is another figure who is curiously absent from Matthews' study, and given Schlegel's work on the role of mythology in addressing the modern condition, and on the role of art in shaping philosophy's tasks, some consideration of his relation to Schelling's thought would have been valuable in creating a more detailed portrait of Schelling's organic form of philosophy. Even
J.W. von Goethe (1749-1832) receives just one scant reference as a "great modern poet" who has succeeded in articulating his own "mythological circle" (p. 200). Yet, Goethe, like Schelling, was concerned with the problem of origins: as Schelling searched for the Urform of philosophy, Goethe famously searched for the Urpflanze -- and for both thinkers, the cause of science and the cause (or issue) of beauty were not to be separated. Matthews' account of Schelling's aesthetic philosophy (in Chapter Six, the final chapter of the study), would have been strengthened had he drawn upon the deep affinities between Goethe and Schelling. Matthews' account of Schelling's aesthetic philosophy is too sketchy to be convincing. And part of the vagueness of Matthews' account of "aesthetic philosophy" is due to the absence of figures such as Hölderlin, Schlegel, Goethe, and even Alexander von Humboldt (1769-1859), who were each working to free philosophy from the narrow confines into which Matthews claims Hegel sought to restrict it -- that is, to free it from a notion of philosophy as something that must be teachable, to something more like, "the highest act of freedom" (xii).
Matthews is ambitious in his work, attempting what he well describes as the Herculean challenge of following "all of Schelling's work as it unfolds in a continuous progression" (219). In presenting Schelling's early work and the points of Schelling's work that connect him to Plato and Kant, Matthews' hermeneutical and analytic work is of the highest quality. But if we really want to evaluate Schelling after we have "heard him to the end," then I think we must open our reading to a wider constellation of thinkers than the group that populates Matthews' study. In particular, the affinities that Schelling's guiding philosophical concerns had with the work of thinkers who were also interested in the new mythology and in our connection to the Greeks should be highlighted, which would entail the presence of the other Friedrichs of the period (Hölderlin, von Hardenberg [Novalis], and Schlegel), and of the other great early nineteenth-century thinkers of nature in the German-speaking world, Goethe and Humboldt.
To return to my initial questions: Is the hunt for a fundamental idea in the philosopher disparagingly dubbed by Hegel as the "Proteus of philosophy" a Quixotic search? Does Matthews convincingly show that if there is indeed such a fundamental idea to be found in Schelling's philosophy, that such a fundamental idea is organic form? I think a great merit of Matthews' study is that he does convincingly show that Schelling was more like Hercules than like Proteus, and that in carrying out his philosophical project, Schelling, with great focus and strength, did indeed provide a consistent direction to his thought, disparate as it might seem to an uncharitable reader.