2019.01.05

Jeff Kochan

Science as Social Existence: Heidegger and the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge

Jeff Kochan, Science as Social Existence: Heidegger and the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge, Open Book, 2017, 446pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781783744107.

Reviewed by Dimitri Ginev


Jeff Kochan's book is distinguished by clearly formulated theses, convincing arguments, and far-reaching consequences. It continues the tradition of existential-phenomenological theories of science begun by Joseph Kockelmans, Patrick Heelan, Theodore Kisiel, and Martin Eger. The seven chapters focus on the possibility of integrating a phenomenological concept of subjectivity with the cognitive sociology of science; the idea of minimal realism; the assessment of the Bloor-Latour debate from the viewpoint of existential analytic; the Heideggerian reading of the social foundations of logic; the concept of the mathematical projection of nature in connection with the Scientific Revolution of the 16th and 17th centuries; and the role of the existential conception of science for preventing the rise of new forms of essentialism in science studies.

All the issues revolve around the possibility for a productive dialogue between the strong program in the social studies of science and several existentialist-phenomenological doctrines about scientific objectivity. A superficial reading might suggest that Kochan tries to build bridges across seemingly converging positions of the strong program -- a naturalistic and causal-explanatory program -- and existential analytic by deconstructing the Cartesian hypostatization of the subject-object schema. Consequently, he is simply developing a "social phenomenology" of science-as-social-existence by conflating a constructivist and an existentialist approach. Yet this reading is superficial because it ignores the fact that the two approaches conceptualize the production of scientific knowledge at two levels separated by (what Heidegger calls) the ontological difference. The "ontological incommensurability" between the sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK) and existential phenomenology does not remain hidden from Kochan's attentive analyses, although he firmly believes that the ontological difference should not be construed as a dichotomous distinction.

The strong program of SSK looks for ways of identifying local, contingent, causes of scientists' beliefs. In opposing Lakatos's insistence on asymmetric treatment of scientists' ethos of doing research as subjected to methodological rationality and scientists' transgressions of the codes of such a rationality, Strong Programmers assume that all theoretical constructions in science equally face the problem of credibility, and all differences in credibility are equally in need of causal explanation. The task of the existential conception of science is completely different. It consists in studying the genesis of scientific objectification from the pre-predicative being-in-the-world. Kochan takes into account that existential analytic (including the existential conception of science) does not provide causal (or any other kind of) explanations. It reveals hermeneutic-ontological phenomena by phenomenologically studying their own interpretive constitution within horizons of temporality. It would be wrong to admit that Kochan looks for a dialogue by "naturalizing" Heidegger's ontology, and ascribing to the existential conception of science an explanatory function. By doing justice to the non-explanatory character of existential analytic, he carefully avoids such an objectivist fallacy.

The guiding thread in Kochan's search for a dialogue is provided by the observation that the champions of SSK and the founder of hermeneutic phenomenology are committed to the view that cognitive order is grounded in social order. Yet the social in the former case is normatively organized empirical reality of institutionalized positions, statuses, roles, structural relations, and normatively mediated interactions, while existential analytic addresses the social in terms of the forms of solicitude operating within the reality of being-with-one-another as this reality is meaningfully constituted within-the-world. The ontological approach to the social suggested in Being and Time is untranslatable into any kind of purely ontic approach (in particular to that of the constructivist programs in sociology). In coping with this untranslatability, Kochan -- remaining firm in his belief about the non-dichotomous character of the ontological difference -- launches parallel moves of ontologically revising SSK's strong program and "sociologically reading" existential analytic. The main result of this doubly orientated initiative is the introduction of a phenomenological concept of subjectivity (indispensably involved in scientific inquiry) that enriches the (metaphysically stylized) epistemic subject with important existential dimensions.

In trying to scrutinize the existentially conceived subjectivity playing a constitutive role in scientific inquiry, Kochan suggests a new reading of (what Heidegger conceptualizes in terms of) "the mathematical projection of nature". For him, this projection does not stand for a formally codified conceptual structure enabling the factual articulation of a thematically delimited domain. The book's most ambitious statement is that the mathematical projection of nature is an existentiale (in the sense of Heidegger's distinction between existentiales and categories). The mathematical projection stipulates "existential conditions" for having (theoretical and experimental) scientific activity. However, the character of being an existentiale is not postulated, but carefully and incrementally unveiled. Prima facie the reader may get the impression that Kochan tears off the mathematical projection from the rest of scientific practices, endowing it with a quasi-Platonic status. Accordingly, it could be supposed that he deprives it of phronetic distinctiveness. The mathematical projection of nature ceases to be composed of particular scientific practices related to various sorts of non-scientific social practices. Thus considered, the concept under discussion would imply a kind of mathematical essentialism. Yet Kochan convincingly dispels this wrong impression by suggesting largescale historical analyses of how Early Modernity has brought the mathematical projection of nature into being. He seems to follow the method of existential analytic which Heidegger calls formal indication.

To be sure, the mathematical projection of nature is not handled as an existential phenomenon in Being and Time. Kochan succeeds in treating it as such by designing his historical analyses in accordance with the method of formal indication. The mathematical projection is progressively revealed by a revisable way of pointing out its basic facets as they have been historically taking shape. This is why much of the book is devoted to the Early Modern formation of that configuration of scientific practices which enables the totality of science-as-social-existence-within-mathematically-projected-horizons. Kochan argues that by stipulating existential conditions, this projection specifies those important features of "the subjectivity of the subject" which are indispensable for the social organization of scientific objectification.

Kochan has good reasons for believing that the reform of classical epistemology undertaken by sociologists of scientific knowledge is not radical enough since it is still uncritically committed to the primacy of the dualism of subject and object. For him, SSK can successfully be radicalized by integrating a "Heideggerian phenomenological deconstruction of Cartesianism" into it. Kochan admits that the symmetry principle (the requirement that true and false formulations, on the one hand, and rational and irrational beliefs, on the other, should sociologically be explained in the same way) has to be revised in a manner that is capable of liberating the principle from its epistemological confinement. The symmetry principle as serving the strong program rests on ontological presuppositions that have to be made explicit. In this regard, Kochan stresses again the priority of the mathematical projection. Generally speaking, the latter -- as a processual phenomenon that accompanies the disclosure and articulation of any domain of scientific inquiry -- is fore-structuring the cognitive structures incorporated in scientific knowledge. The point he is making, however, goes further than this observation.

According to Kochan, the existential-phenomenological conceptualization of the way in which the mathematical projection operates in the articulation of reality should fore-structure the (causal) sociological explanations about the interests guiding the dynamics of scientific inquiry. Presumably, the social interests intervene in the hermeneutic circularity set up by the relations between the mathematically projected horizon of possibilities for doing research and the articulated units within the research process. By intervening in this way, these interests more or less determine the (true and false) beliefs of scientists. Yet Kochan distances himself from such an assumption. From the existential-phenomenological standpoint he supports, scientific inquiry is a trans-subjective process that is capable of resisting subjective and inter-subjective influences. All social interests that scientists and non-scientists (politically managing the organization of scientific institutions) are of subjective and inter-subjective nature. Once the intrinsic (trans-subjective) hermeneutic circularity has become established in a certain domain of inquiry, the research process -- as fore-structuring of cognitive structures -- is no longer dependent on interests that are external to the trans-subjective process of inquiry.

The main lesson to be learned from Kochan's book concerns the way in which the mathematical projection of a domain of nature warrants the interpretive autonomy of scientific inquiry. But this lesson does not imply that the social interests are surgically removed from the cognitive body of science. Doubtless, they influence the processes of inquiry. Yet they do this not by causally determining scientists' beliefs. They can exercise certain influence only after being transformed or translated into special research interests. The only way of satisfying the latter is via appropriating and actualizing possibilities from the mathematically projected horizon. Against the background of this hermeneutic internalism, the ontological reformulation of the symmetry principle comes into play: though all social interests translated into special research interests are equally in need of sociological explanations, one should not forget that these ontic explanations are ontologically secondary with regard to the existential-phenomenological analysis of how scientific domains become disclosed and articulated in the hermeneutic circularity of research processes. In other words, the principle of hermeneutic internalism has ontological priority over the symmetry principle. This priority does not entail, however, that there is a crucial gap between the trans-subjectivity of the mathematically projected horizon and the subjectivity characterizing the factual reality of science-as-social-existence. The former is always integrated with the latter, since the trans-subjective hermeneutic circularity does not put into effect its own agency. The only driving force of the research process is agency stemming from the subjectivity of the participants in this process. This is why Kochan's main preoccupation is with that subjectivity.

As stated earlier, Kochan tries to retain the rights of "the subjectivity of the subject" beyond Cartesian assumptions. He is aware that his efforts can be successful if he is able to rejoin (in his words) the liberal and conservative reactions against the restoration of the rights of subjectivity in science studies. Reactions of the former type are provoked by fears of reasserting the authority of the subject-object schema, and re-imposing constraints on the post-Cartesian scientific imagination. The conservative reactions, in turn, are released by the threat of rehabilitating subjectivist views criticizing the objectivity of the currently accepted scientific theories. Kochan counters the arguments supporting both types of reactions by arguing that the subject is not something to which a world can be external. He elaborates on the subjectivity's existential dimensions of being-in-the-world, being-with-one-another, interpretive understanding (as guided by the pre-predicative "hermeneutic as"), and affectivity (considered in analogy to Heidegger's concept of Befindlichkeit). The reader will be surprised to find that these dimensions of subjectivity are initially introduced and discussed in a purely factual manner by means of examples taken from empirical disciplines.

It would be a mistake, however, to assume that the author attributes to the existential-phenomenological concept of subjectivity four ontic characteristics. Indeed, Kochan pursues a strategy that for didactic reasons looks like a "self-defeating strategy". He first discusses the four characteristics in purely existentiell terms. Thus, anxiety is illustrated with psychiatric phenomena like the symptoms of the post-traumatic stress disorder. In a similar manner, he argues that a sociologically extended theory of the foundations of logic can succeed in conceptualizing the subjectivity's characteristic of being-with-one-another. The association of pre-predicative interpretive understanding with tacit knowledge also seems to be subjected to a kind of ontic reading of subjectivity. But most striking in this regard is the construal of the fourth basic characteristic of the subjectivity of the subject in terms closer to the "affective aspects of scientific knowledge production". However, all these discussions in existentiell terms should only convince the reader that working out factual descriptions and causal (or functional) explanations of the described states of affairs does not suffice to capture the existential (factical) integrity of the subjectivity of the subject.

Kochan's self-defeating strategy works well as preparation for the surprising change-over: at the moment when the reader admits that the whole analysis of the subjectivity of the subject begins to lose its phenomenological character, and to downgrade to a mixture of personal-psychological, emotive-behaviorist, sociological, clinical-psychiatrist, and social-psychological descriptions, he turns to and begins portraying that unity of the four characteristics which cannot be cast by purely empirical studies. There is no longer confusion of existentiell descriptions with existential analysis: the reader is presented with a coherent phenomenological concept of subjectivity. The preliminary existentiell elaborations turn out to be fruitful in serving their didactic function by enabling the transition. The implementation of the self-defeating strategy accompanied by the surprising change-over are completely justified. The book is addressed to the whole range of experts in science studies. Accordingly, the transition from empirical profiles of subjectivity to a phenomenological-existential portrayal of subjectivity has to be carefully carried out. Kochan successfully tackles several issues involved in this complex task.

Once he has portrayed the subjectivity of the subject which can initiate a productive cooperation between constructivist cognitive sociology and Heideggerian phenomenology, Kochan formulates a claim that can be called a "principle of humility". The reason for introducing it rests in the significance of the finitude of human existence for approaching the existential roots of scientific objectivity. The principle of humility provides the frame for reevaluating the Bloor-Latour debate. Dasein is always already situated within-the-world, and -- since it projects its way of being upon possibilities inscribed on the world-horizon -- Dasein (like the world) is ontologically distinguished by transcendence. In brief, Dasein (including the Dasein of science as a mode of existence) is characterized by situated transcendence. Kochan takes seriously the existential-analytical view that Dasein is the transcending entity in which agential subjectivity and world's trans-subjectivity exist in ecstatic unity. With regard to this view, situated transcendence stands for the entanglement of agential subjectivity with trans-subjective horizons of possibilities. It is this kind of transcendence -- as implied by the finitude of human existence -- that seems to be ignored by both social constructivists and actor-network theorists. Taking it into consideration requires a philosophical humility that, according to Kochan, consists in a voluntary restraining from (constructionist or post-humanist) metaphysical ambitions and pretensions.

At first glance, the Bloor-Latour debate looks like a continuation of the philosophical debate about the Kantian thing-in-itself by non-philosophical means. Kochan shows that the debate can without any difficulty be reconstructed in this way. The appeal of both protagonists to the thing-in-itself seems to prompt and facilitate such a reconstruction. Actually, however, Kochan undertakes a Heideggerian move, thereby reorienting the debate towards the finitude and transcendence of Dasein's existence. He frees the Bloor-Latour debate from its Kantian framework. Kochan is absolutely right that both protagonists engage Kantian positions. Latour dismisses the thing-in-itself as irrelevant to giving accounts of the production of scientific knowledge, while Bloor recast Kant's concept in naturalistic and sociological terms. Bloor's treatment of the thing-in-itself is compatible with that position of minimalizing standard realism which Kochan tries to surmount. As will be discussed below, Kochan's intention is to break with the treatment of minimal-realism-qua-minimalized-standard-realism. At stake in these efforts is the endeavor to carve out a version of minimal realism which opens the avenue to a realism corresponding to the tenets of existential phenomenology.

Kochan critique on Latour is based on the non-individualist view of subjectivity (as characterized by the four traits). Some implications from this critique pave the way for revisions of actor-network theory in line with the ontological difference of existential phenomenology. At stake in Latour's "anthropology of the moderns" is the (post-humanist) reformulation of the question of the correspondence between the world and statements about the world. This is not a question about the production of epistemic representations of the world. By posing it, Latour aims at deconstructing the formula "adequatio rei et intellectus". In so doing, he conceives of correspondence as a networking of two modes of existence, a conceptual and a material one. Kochan rightly observes that, to a large extent, Latour's insistence on existence sounds like a Heideggerian motif. A mode of existence is a regime of recurrent events and processes. But the modes are described in terms of factual discontinuities within factual continuities. By ignoring the facticity of existence, Latour is unable to approach the correspondence in terms of what always already transcends the factuality of these processes. Since he avoids the introduction of the ontological difference in his theory, he lacks a proper concept of facticity related to the finitude of existence and the transcendence of the world. Kochan's arguments are oriented towards the situated transcendence of that (non-Cartesian and non-Kantian) subjectivity which mediates between the two modes of existence. He also alludes to Heidegger's position that what transcends the entities-within-the-world is interpretively fore-structuring them: facticity is the transcendence which fore-structures, thereby enabling the temporalizing of temporality. The actor-network theory has no resources for conceptualizing the constellation of finitude, fore-structuring, transcendence, and temporalizing. As a consequence, this theory is not capable of integrating the ontological difference with its research scenarios.

It is the critique of Latour's position that specifies Kochan's commitment to minimal realism. Here again Kochan undertakes the strategy of a pas de deux between an implied reader (who is inclined to initiate a deficient and privative reading) and his actual position. In a first step, he draws all important consequences from minimizing the position of standard realism. Then, he undertakes an overcoming of this approach by recasting the issue of the "access to reality" in terms of that kind of "derivability" of the subject-object relation which is at stake in the existential conception of science. He offers several arguments showing that the residual Kantianism of minimal-realism-qua-minimalized-standard-realism presupposes that mental activities are making the reality out there into a meaningful reality. According to existential phenomenology, however, there is no reality beyond the constitution of meaning. Scientific inquiry objectifies by disclosing and meaningfully articulating (domains of) reality.

The issues of the "external world" posed by all positions hypostatizing the subject-object schema are senseless issues. For Kochan, the talk of minimal realism only makes sense if it is related to the mathematical projection of nature. To make entities present within scientific practices does not amount to experiencing them as a presence-at-hand that is statically located out there. Any form of the metaphysics of presence should be excluded from developing the position of minimal realism. Making entities present by objectifying them amounts to a thematic de-contextualization of these entities, which can only be accomplished in a proper context of scientific practices. It is precisely the mathematical projection that plays the leading role in this "contextualized de-contextualization". Minimal realism as an epistemological position that minimizes standard realism is not capable of coping with the interplay of meaningful articulation and objectification of reality within scientific inquiry. Kochan shows that there is no room for such a minimized position in a theory of science-as-social-existence based on existential phenomenology.

I will conclude by offering two necessary criticisms. Although the need for non-Cartesian and non-Kantian minimal realism is convincingly demonstrated, the very position of this realism, which bears the burden of proof of the book's central theses, is quite minimally developed. My second criticism concerns a basic deficiency in the reading of the existential conception of science. Kochan accuses Joseph Rouse, Patricia Glazebrook, and others of ignoring Heidegger's distinction between existence and essence. In fact, the main reason why Heidegger develops the existential conception of science consists in showing that the way of addressing this distinction cannot avoid the problematic of the temporalizing of temporality. Kochan ignores an essential aspect of the existential conception by skipping the problematic of the temporalizing of temporality. The main deficiency of his reading of the existential conception of science is that he overlooks the temporal facet of making-present-through-objectification. Regardless of how strongly it is formally codified, procedural objectification always has its own regime of temporalizing de-temporalization. In other words, scientific objectification makes present by achieving a de-temporalization (of what becomes objectified) within its own horizon of temporality. Heidegger argues that like Dasein's basic mode of being-in-the-world, the "derivative" mode of being-in-the-world-by-objectifying-the-world finds its meaning in temporality. Like all meaningful entities taking place in the facticity of existence, the procedurally objectified scientific objects always remain amenable to a meaningful reconstitution within the temporalizing of the mathematically projected horizon (conceived of as a horizon of temporality). The position of minimal realism Kochan aims at can only be spelled out and consequently defended by addressing the regimes of the temporalizing of temporality taking place in scientific inquiry.