2017.05.18

T. Parent

Self-Reflection for the Opaque Mind: An Essay in Neo-Sellarsian Philosophy

T. Parent, Self-Reflection for the Opaque Mind: An Essay in Neo-Sellarsian Philosophy, Routledge, 2017, 296pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138668826.

Reviewed by Ryan Cox, University of Hamburg


The aim of this book is to defend a solution to what T. Parent calls "the Problem of Wayward Reflection" (p. 36). The problem is that critical self-reflection -- the activity of reflecting on, and evaluating our own attitudes from the armchair -- is rational only if we can reliably know our own attitudes from the armchair, and yet, it seems that we cannot reliably know our own attitudes from the armchair.

On the face of it, critical self-reflection is 'an important part of our intellectual and moral lives' (p. 35). Part of the value of critical self-reflection is that it can 'expose skewed priorities, inconsistencies, non-sequiturs in reasoning, and so forth' (p. 35). However, evidence from empirical psychology seems to suggest that we are largely ignorant about our own minds (p. 36). In particular, evidence from empirical psychology seems to suggest that we are largely ignorant of our reasons for moral judgements (Haidt 2001), and even for buying one pair of stockings over another (Nisbett and Wilson 1977, Wilson 2001). Moreover, there are philosophical arguments, based on externalism about mental content, which seem to show that we cannot reliably know our own minds from the armchair alone (Boghossian 1992, McKinsey 1991).

The Problem of Wayward Reflection may be thought of in terms of a clash between what Wilfred Sellars (1962) called the 'manifest image' and the 'scientific image' (see Parent's discussion on pp. 3-4). It is part of the manifest image that we have reliable access to our own minds, and can reflect on and evaluate our attitudes from the armchair. However, the scientific image seems to suggest that we are largely ignorant about our own minds. Thus, Parent takes his task to be the Neo-Sellarsian task of responding to this tension between the manifest and scientific images (pp. 25-26).

Parent's solution to the Problem of Wayward Reflection is to argue that things are not as they seem: we can reliably come to know our own attitudes from the armchair, so critical self-reflection can be rational. (For the opposite response see Kornblith 2012). Parent defends "the radical view that, in some identifiable circumstances, we are infallible about our own occurrent beliefs" (p. 40). He argues that the evidence from empirical psychology is compatible with this kind of infallibility thesis, and that philosophical arguments which purport to show that we simply cannot know our own attitudes from the armchair are ultimately unsatisfactory.

The book has four parts. The first, "Preliminaries", includes a preamble on philosophical methodology, an introduction to the problem of wayward reflection -- which connects the problem to broader issues in philosophical and psychological methodology (pp. 38-40) -- and a chapter which argues that "some form of infallibilism is consistent with the existing psychological data" (p. 51).

The second part, "Knowledge of Thought", defends infallibilism about self-knowledge of thought. It begins with a chapter explicating and defending the thesis that our thoughts about our own thoughts are infallible. This chapter is followed by two chapters responding to arguments which proceed from the assumption of content externalism and which purport to show that we cannot know what we are thinking. A final chapter shows how the infallibility thesis provides a response to the problem of "Wayward Reflection via Thought Switching" (p. 37).

The third, and most challenging part, "Knowledge of Judging", defends infallibilism about self-knowledge of judgement (where judgements are taken to be occurrent beliefs). It begins with a chapter explicating and defending the thesis that, at least for a particular class of judgements, our judgements about our own judgements are infallible. This chapter is followed by a chapter explicating and defending the thesis that in certain identifiable contexts, if you express a particular second-order judgement, then that judgement is true. These chapters are followed by two chapters responding to arguments which purport to show that we cannot know what we are thinking. These arguments parallel the arguments from context externalism addressed in the second part of the book. A final chapter shows how the infallibility thesis provides a response to what Parent calls the problem of "Wayward Reflection via Attitude Switching" (p. 38). The fourth part, "Denouement", consists of a summary of the arguments of the book and further reflections on philosophical methodology.

For the remainder of this review, I will focus on the infallibility theses defended in Chapter 3 and Chapter 7 respectively, as these form the core of Parent's solution to the Problem of Wayward Reflection. The first infallibility thesis is defended in Ch. 3, "Infallibility in Knowing What One Thinks". The thesis is roughly this (p. 84):

INF1: necessarily, if you think that you think that p, you think that p.

Importantly, 'think' doesn't mean 'believe' in INF1. Rather, "to think p is to have some propositional attitude or other with the content that p" (p. 84). Moreover, the thesis is restricted to occurrent mental states, and is held to be psychologically necessary (p. 84).

According to Parent, INF1 follows from "minimal assumptions about the language of thought" (p. 86). The first assumption is (p. 87):

Assumption from the Language of Thought Hypothesis: you think that p if and only if you token the language of thought expression "P".

(I will assume that "P" is a language of thought expression with the content that p, and that it is the only language of thought expression with this content.)

The idea here is that to think that p just is to token a language of thought expression with the content that p. Parent doesn't say exactly what it is to token a language of thought expression, however. The idea seems to be that you token a language of thought expression if and only if you bear a particular relation to a token of that language of thought expression, like the "believing" relation, or the "desiring" relation, or some other appropriate relation. The thought is, then, that you believe that p if and only if you bear the "believing" relation to a token of a language of thought expression whose content is the proposition that p. (Importantly, according to Parent, the arguments of this chapter, and Chapter 7, can be recast without recourse to the language of thought hypothesis. See p. 89 and pp. 160-161 for discussion).

The second assumption is (p. 87):

Minimal Compositionality Assumption: if you token a language of thought expression of the form "X Vs that P", then you token the language of thought expression "P".

According to Parent, the Minimal Compositionality Assumption "reflects the compositional nature of the language of thought" (p. 87) (c.f. Fodor 1975).

The argument for the first infallibility thesis (slightly adapted from p. 87) then goes as follows:

(1) You think that you think that q. (Assume for Conditional Proof)
(2) You think that P if and only if you token the language of thought expression "P". (Assumption from the Language of Thought Hypothesis)
(3) Therefore, you token the expression "I think that Q". (From (1) and (2))
(4) If you token a language of thought expression of the form "X Vs that P", then you token the language of thought expression "P". (Minimal Compositionality Assumption)
(5) The expression "I think that Q" has the form "X Vs that P". (Assumption)
(6) Therefore, if you token "I think that Q", you token "Q". (From (4) and (5))
(7) Therefore, you token "Q". (From (6) and (3))
(8) Therefore, you think that q. (From (2) and (7))
(9) Therefore, if you think that you think that q, you think that q. (Conditional proof, (1)-(8))

If this argument succeeds, it shows that a substantial kind of infallibility thesis follows from a modest empirical hypothesis about the nature of psychological attitudes.

According to Parent, the most contentious assumption of the argument is the Minimal Compositionality Assumption (p. 87). However, I think that the Minimal Compositionality Assumption is empirically plausible, and philosophically uncontentious. The most philosophically contentious assumption is the Assumption from the Language of Thought Hypothesis. To see this, it is helpful to contrast the assumption with a weaker assumption:

Assumption from the Language of Thought Hypothesis*: you think that p if you token the unembedded language of thought expression "P", and only if you token the language of thought expression "P".

This assumption is weaker, because it only holds that tokening an unembedded language of thought expression with the content that p suffices for thinking that p, rather than holding that tokening a language of thought expression, whether embedded or unembedded, suffices for thinking that p. While it is true that proponents of the language of thought hypothesis often write as if they are committed to the claim that you think that p if and only if you token the language of thought expression "P", it is plausible that 'expression' is implicitly taken to mean 'unembedded expression'. In any case, the important question is whether the strong version of the Assumption from the Language of Thought Hypothesis is plausible. And I suspect that it is not.

Suppose you bear the "believing" relation to a token of the language of thought expression "John believes that Jane smokes". It follows from the Minimal Compositionality Assumption that you token the language of thought expression "Jane smokes", but it doesn't follow that you bear the "believing" relation to it. This is just to say that it doesn't follow that you believe that Jane smokes. Does it follow that you have some propositional attitude with the proposition that p as its content? Let's suppose, plausibly, that you don't desire that Jane smokes, or intend that Jane smokes, or hope that Jane smokes, or wish that Jane smokes, or doubt that Jane smokes. On the face of it, there is no reason to think that you have any attitude at all toward the proposition that Jane smokes. Doesn't this suggest that you can token a language of thought expression with the content that p, without having any attitude at all with the content that p?

Perhaps it follows from the fact that you token the language of thought expression "I think that Jane smokes" that you bear the "entertainment" relation to that language of thought expression "Jane smokes". It is intuitively plausible, after all, that if you think that you think that Jane smokes, you must at least entertain the proposition that Jane smokes. But the question then is whether bearing the "entertainment" relation to a language of thought expression suffices for having some attitude or other with the content of that expression as its content. And this turns on whether entertaining a proposition counts as having an attitude towards that proposition. Insofar as taking any attitude at all towards a proposition presupposes that you entertain that proposition, I think that entertaining a proposition should not be thought of as a kind of attitude.

All of this is to say that I think that, at best, it is the weaker version of the assumption from the language of thought hypothesis which is a "minimal assumption about the language of thought". But Parent's argument does not go through on the weaker assumption. The stronger version of the assumption is needed. But it is philosophically contentious and in need of further defense.

Parent defends the second infallibility thesis in Chapter 7, "Infallibility in Knowing What One Judges". The second infallibility thesis is roughly this (p. 158):

INF2: necessarily, if you judge that you judge that p, then you judge that p.

According to Parent, to judge that p is to occurrently believe that p. On the face of it, INF2 doesn't look like a very plausible thesis. And, indeed, Parent concedes that it must be restricted to a particular class of judgements. To see why, suppose that you judge that you judge that p. It follows that you bear the "judging" relation to a token of the language of thought expression "I judge that P". However, you can bear this relation to a token of the language of thought expression "I judge that P" without bearing it to a token of the language of thought expression "P". So, you can judge that you judge that P without judging that P.

According to Parent, progress can be made by focusing on language of thought expressions which purport to refer to the acts of judging they are about (compare Burge 1988). Consider the language of thought expression "I judge hereby that P". According to Parent, "hereby" purports to refer to an act of judging that P, and "that" purports to refer to the content of the language of thought expression "P". In this respect, the language of thought expression "I judge hereby that P" differs from the language of thought expression "I judge that P" in that the former has a constituent which purports to refer to an act of judging that P.

Unfortunately, as Parent points out, the infallibility thesis still does not follow, even if it is restricted to judgements which involve tokening the language of thought expression "I judge hereby that P". As he notes, it is possible to judge that you judge hereby that P without judging that P. In such a case "hereby" will fail to refer to an act of judging that P, and your judgement will be false (p. 163).

Parent insists, however, that there is some intuitive pull to the idea that the language of thought expression "I judge, hereby, that P" "semantically entails its own truth" (p. 164), and that there is something to the thought that it does so only if it has a constituent which refers to an act of judging that P, a constituent like "hereby" in "I judge hereby that P" (p. 164). But the problem, as Parent sees it, is that there is nothing about the language of thought expression "I judge, hereby, that P" having a constituent which purports to refer to an act of judging that P which ensures that whenever one bears the "judging" relation to a token of this expression, one judges that P.

Parent's solution is to appeal to what he calls "Lagadonian Reference". The basic idea is that acts of judging might (i) refer to themselves, and (ii) these judgements which purport to refer to themselves might be constituents of language of thought expressions.

Parent writes:

Here, then, is the infallibilist's new gambit: If we suppose a mental parataxis can self-attribute the first-order act by means of its Lagadonian name, then in those cases there is no issue about failed reference. After all, when the act itself is used in self-attributing the act, it is impossible for the self-attribution to occur in the absence of the act. The term used to attribute the act just is that self-same act! So, if the act goes missing, then the attribution cannot be made in the relevant Lagadonian way. Thus, if infallibilism is limited to such "semi-Lagadonian" second-order judgements, then all the relevant self-attributions are invariably true. (p. 167)

So, the thought is that some language of thought expressions of the form "I judge that I judge that P" have a constituent akin to "hereby" in "I judge, hereby, that I judge that P" which purports to refer to an act of judging that P. This constituent just is the act of judging that P, and refers, unfailingly, to itself. Therefore, if you token such an expression, it will be true.

This is a strikingly original proposal about the relationship between second-order judgements and first-order judgements. Unfortunately, however, Parent does not do much to argue for it, at least in Chapter 7 itself. Rather, he seems to assume that there is a certain class of judgements expressed by "I judge, hereby, that P" which are infallible, which "semantically entail their own truth". He then shows how this could be possible -- i.e. if such judgements involve language of thought expressions with constituents which purport to refer to acts of judging, and those constituents just are the acts of judging themselves. Parent writes: "All this remains obviously speculative, however, and Lagadonian mental representation at best has the status of an unconfirmed posit" (p. 168). Of course, this would be dialectically appropriate if Parent were right that there is some intuitive pull to the idea that the judgement expressed by "I judge, hereby, that P" "semantically entails its own truth". But I myself do not find this idea very intuitive. And I suspect that those unsympathetic to infallibilism will be similarly unmoved. So there is little independent evidence for these claims given in Chapter 7. Nonetheless, while Parent offers no independent evidence for these claims in this chapter, he does offer an argument in later chapters (see, in particular, the appendix to Chapter 8), and they might be motivated as part of the best explanation of how critical self-reflection can be possible.

The Problem of Wayward Reflection holds significant interest, and deserves sustained philosophical attention. Parent has shown significant ingenuity in addressing the tension between our commitment to the value of critical self-reflection and evidence from empirical psychology, and there is much of interest in this book (in particular, the discussion of the philosophical arguments from content externalism to skepticism about self-knowledge) However, I've argued that some of the premises of the arguments for the infallibility theses need further defense before they can provide us with a satisfactory solution to the Problem of Wayward Reflection.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENTS

Thanks to David Chalmers, Luara Ferracioli, Naomi Kloosterboer, Ted Parent, and Daniel Stoljar for comments on this review.

REFERENCES

Boghossian, P. 1992: Externalism and inference. Philosophical Issues, 2, pp. 11-28.

Burge, T. 1988: Individualism and self-knowledge. Journal of Philosophy, 85, pp. 649-663.

Fodor, J. A. 1975: The Language of Thought. Thomas Y. Crowell Co.

Haidt, J. 2001: The emotional dog and its rational tail: A social intuitionist approach to moral judgement. Psychological Review, 108, pp. 814-834.

Kornblith, H. 2012: On Reflection. Oxford University Press.

McKinsey, M. 1991: Anti-individualism and privileged access, Analysis, 51, pp. 9-16.

Nisbett, R. and Wilson, T. 1977: Telling more than we can know: Verbal reports on mental processes. Psychological Review, 8, pp. 231-259.

Sellars, W. 1962: Philosophy and the scientific image of man. Reprinted in Science, Perception and Reality. Routledge and Kegan Paul, pp. 1-40.

Wilson, T. 2002: Strangers to Ourselves Belknap Press.