The preface of Jesse J. Prinz's The Conscious Brain invites a comparison with David J. Chalmers's The Conscious Mind. It is a comparison that can be quickly made: the books are as different as two philosophical books on consciousness could be --
Where he [Chalmers] sought to synthesize two decades of dualist argumentation, I [Prinz] try here to synthesize two decades of empirical exploration. (p. xi - xii)
Chalmers's synthesis led him to claim that 'no explanation given in wholly physical terms can ever account for the emergence of conscious experience' (Chalmers, 1996, p. 93), Prinz's leads him to claim that there is now 'a satisfying and surprisingly complete theory [given in wholly physical terms] of how consciousness arises in the human brain' (p. 3).
Although Prinz explicitly invites the comparison with Chalmers's book, he refrains from entering into the debates for which Chalmers set the terms, only remarking, towards the beginning of his penultimate chapter, that
I won't directly address modal arguments or zombie arguments, but readers should be able to imagine how my response to Jackson [that is, to the knowledge argument] could be extended in these directions. (p. 293)
Nor does Prinz have any sympathy with the way in which the Chalmers-style debates were framed. Chalmers urged us to 'first isolate the truly hard part of the problem [of consciousness], separating it from more tractable parts' (Chalmers, 1995, p. 200). Several psychologists resisted this urging. Prinz is in complete agreement with them. To see just how complete, recall that the 'easy problems of consciousness', as Chalmers identified them in 1995, were the problems of explaining:
- the ability to discriminate, categorize, and react to environmental stimuli;
- the integration of information by a cognitive system;
- the reportability of mental states;
- the ability of a system to access its own internal states;
- the focus of attention;
- the deliberate control of behavior;
- the difference between wakefulness and sleep. (Chalmers, 1995, p. 201)
Chalmers reckoned that it would take 'a century or two of difficult empirical work' before these problems could be solved, and that the results of that work would leave the hard problem of consciousness untouched. Prinz rejects both points. He recounts the progress that has already been made in addressing these 'easy problems'. He suggests that the results of this progress provide the basis for a theory telling us what consciousness is, in what way it is unified, how it emerges, where and why. Although he does not explicitly identify them as such, it is the items on Chalmers's list of easy problems (with the possible exception of the last item) that provide the ingredients for this 'surprisingly complete' theory.
At the philosophical core of Prinz's theory is the claim that consciousness occurs when and only when an integrated representation of a stimulus's several properties, as perceived from a particular point of view, is made available to working memory. This process of making a representation available to working memory is what Prinz calls 'attention'. The crucial property of the representations that get made available by this 'attention process' -- the property of being integrated into a point-of-view-retaining format -- is what Prinz calls 'intermediateness'. His theory is therefore dubbed the 'Attended Intermediate Representation Theory'. Acronym lovers are invited to call it 'AIR'.
'Attended' and 'Intermediate' are both functioning here as terms of art: Prinz provides a scientifically-informed account of what it is for a representation to qualify as 'intermediate', in the sense that he intends, and a scientifically-informed account of what it is for a representation to qualify as 'attended'. It would therefore be only a verbal complaint to argue that certain conscious representations might not deserve the title 'intermediate', as it is usually understood, or to argue (as one very plausibly might) that the normal English word 'attention' refers to something other than the process that Prinz has in mind. On this last point, Prinz allows that 'other researchers may choose to define attention differently', and that 'those who disagree with my analysis of attention could simply drop the term "attention"' (p. 95). He maintains only that this would be an unhelpful move. In both cases it is the scientifically informed details that do Prinz's work, rather than any common sense conception, but in both cases there is room for controversy about how much work these details can really do. Following Prinz's own order of exposition, we can consider the details of the theory's two components in turn.
Once it has been accepted that our brains generate a great many representations while processing the stimuli that we are presented with, and once it has been accepted that our conscious states must derive their contents from those representations, there is then a question about what it is that enables the organism who has a representation-rich brain to be consciously aware of some, but only some, of the contents that are represented in it.
As a first step towards approaching this question, one might want to specify which of the representations generated by the brain have contents that correspond to the contents of conscious experiences. On this point, introspection seems to be a guide. The cognitive scientists postulate representations of second derivatives, of binocular disparities, of isolated edges, and of allocentric geometric forms. Introspection suggests that none of these representations is ever handled in a way that makes its content an object of conscious experience. In the case of vision -- from which all of these examples are drawn -- 'we [only] consciously experience a world of surfaces and shapes oriented in specific ways at various distances from us' (p. 52). Of the several representations that are postulated by the cognitive scientists of vision, it is only those at the level of Marr's 2½D sketch that seem to have a content corresponding to the content of a subjective experience. The other representations are either too elementary and piecemeal, or else too detail-omitting and abstract, to be plausibly thought of as making their contents available for conscious experience.
A similar argument, applied to the case of language, leads to a similar conclusion. There again the cognitive scientists postulate a great many representations -- of voice onset times, of words, of meanings, of morphological structures, and of discourse roles. Some of these are given to us in experience, but most are not. Introspection suggests that it is, again, the intermediate-level representations -- the representations of whole sentences with their not-too-abstract properties -- that get to be consciously experienced. Prinz, following the lead of Ray Jackendorf, takes this result of introspection very seriously: intermediateness is taken to be a necessary condition on a representation's coming to consciousness.
In other sensory modalities, especially in those where there is room for controversy about the place of three-dimensional objects or their surfaces in the contents of our experience, introspection is somewhat more equivocal, and the requirements of 'intermediateness' are somewhat less clear. Prinz nonetheless intends that the intermediateness claim should apply across the board, so that it is only ever intermediate representations that contribute their contents to conscious experience. In the subtler modalities he makes the case for the intermediateness of our consciousness-generating representations on anatomical grounds, rather than by reference to the contents of the representations in question. In the case of taste, for example, Prinz cites evidence that the neural correlate of consciously experienced taste is activity in certain parts of the anterior dysgranular insular. He suggests that the representations in these regions qualify as intermediate because the relevant parts of the insular can be understood to be located at intermediate stages in an olfactory processing hierarchy. This suggestion is made with the admission that the science of olfaction does not, in the current state of its development, tell us very much about what representations this hierarchy of olfactory processes might be generating, or what, in olfactory processing, might be analogous to Marr's primal, 2½D, and 3D sketches.
Already, in these relatively uncontroversial parts of Prinz's discussion, one can see the characteristic way in which this book moves between phenomenology, psychology, and neuroscience, and so bears witness to Prinz's conviction that philosophical illumination comes just as much from anatomical details as it does from armchair theorizing, or from cognitive accounts of the brain's information processing. There are very few philosophers of mind who have read as widely or as deeply in the recent scientific literature, and none who bring so broad a range of scientific evidence to bear when constructing their arguments. In accomplishing all of this -- which he does with unfailing readability -- Prinz shows that the phenomenologically plausible claim, that consciousness represents things in an integrated but not-too-abstract way, is well supported, and he shows that a story is beginning to emerge about the way in which these representations might be implemented. He also shows that this claim limits the range of neural representations that can plausibly be thought to play any very immediate role in the production of consciousness. But the philosophical importance of these limits is not entirely clear.
Prinz's claim about intermediateness, even when expanded into an account in which all details of neural realization have been made explicit, might be taken in either of two ways, one of which is modest while the other is ambitious. Taken modestly, the claim enables us to circumscribe our efforts to find an answer to the question of what it is that makes a representation's content come to consciousness. We started out by wondering what has to happen to a representation in order for there to be a conscious subject who is aware of that representation's content. We have now said something, on the basis of various scientific and introspective findings, to identify which representations have this consciousness-creating trick performed upon them. One might think that the nature of this trick is made no less mysterious by discovering it to be a trick that, however it might be done, is not done at the most elementary or most abstract levels in the brain. On this reading, the AIR theory's explanation of the trick itself must be given entirely by that part of the theory that pertains to attention, so that the theory might be read as saying that:
Consciousness is availability to working memory (and it so happens that, in the normal human case, things are so arranged that only intermediate representations enjoy such availability).
The intermediateness claim might also be read more ambitiously, not merely as an attempt to locate the conscious-producing representations, but as an attempt to identify a property of those representations that plays an essential role in explaining why it is that their contents come to consciousness. The AIR theory would then be read as saying
Consciousness is one particular sort of availability to working memory, namely, the availability of intermediate representations.
There are several places in which Prinz seems to have the more modest reading in mind, as when he writes that Jackendorf's introduction of the claim about intermediateness 'identified the contents of consciousness, but . . . has not identified the process by which these contents become conscious' (p. 78). Elsewhere, however, including on the very next page, Prinz's rhetoric seems appropriate to the ambitious reading of this claim, as when he characterizes 'Jackendorf's prescient conjecture that consciousness occurs at the intermediate level of representation', not merely as 'a major boon for the search to find the neural correlates of consciousness' (p. 79), but also as 'the cornerstone of an adequate theory of consciousness, but . . . not sufficient on its own' (p. 78).
The ambitious reading of the intermediateness claim is problematic. If 'consciousness arises when and only when intermediate-level representations are modulated by attention' (p. 89), it should then be impossible for any non-intermediate representation to be handled in such a way that its contents are, in virtue of that handling, conscious. The early symptoms of some schizophrenic patients suggest that this is not impossible. Consider the conscious experience reported by this twenty four year old male, diagnosed with schizophrenia for twelve months:
I see things flat. Whenever there is a sudden change I see it flat. That's why I'm reluctant to go forward. It's as if there were a wall there and I would walk into it. There's no depth, but if I take time to look at things I can pick out the pieces like a jigsaw puzzle, then I know what the wall is made of . . . The picture I see is literally made up of hundreds of pieces. Until I see into things I don't know what distance they are away. (Chapman, 1966, p. 230)
The contents of this patient's visual experiences seem to include contents that are too fragmentary and piecemeal to qualify as 'intermediate' in Prinz's sense. Prinz can admit this possibility only on the reading in which intermediateness plays a modest role in his theory.
Prinz himself seems to allow, what the ambitious reading of the intermediateness claim could not allow, that it is possible for non-intermediate representations to be conscious. He does not consider the possibility of pre-intermediate contents coming into consciousness, as they may in schizophrenia, but he does consider the possibility that post-intermediate contents could come to consciousness. He writes that:
Consciousness makes information available for decisions about what to do, and it exists for that purpose . . . If consciousness were for theoretical reasoning, we might be conscious of more abstract representations. (p. 203)
Perhaps this last conditional should be read as a counterpossible (in which case it is not quite clear what claim is being made), but, if the consequent here is intended to express a genuine possibility, then intermediateness cannot be understood to figure in the AIR theory's account of what is essential to getting the contents of a representation to be experienced by a conscious subject. The account of what it is that makes the difference between the subject's consciousness or unconsciousness of a representation's content must then be given by that part of the theory that pertains to attention.
Although the above considerations have pointed us towards the modest reading of Prinz's intermediateness claim, that reading is not without problems of its own. There is therefore a dilemma here, albeit a dilemma in which one horn is rather more forbidding than the other. The difficulty faced by the modest reading of the intermediateness claim is that there is at least one stage in the book's dialectic that depends on the more ambitious reading. This can be seen in Prinz's response to Kentridge, Heywood and Weiskrantz's finding that GY, a blindsighter, seems able to pay attention to objects of which he is not conscious. This finding would be an apparent counterexample to the claim that:
When we attend, perceptual states become conscious, and when attention is unavailable, consciousness does not arise. Attention, in other words, is necessary and sufficient for consciousness. (p. 89)
It would therefore be a problem for the reading of the AIR theory in which 'consciousness is attention' (p. 49, emphasis added), and in which intermediateness plays only a modest role.
Prinz's response to this problem is, in part, to claim that 'GY may suffer from a general deficit in his object representations, so his success may not reflect the presence of AIRs' (p. 115). The thought here is that GY's lack of consciousness of the things to which he attends might be explained, consistently with the Attended Intermediate Representation Theory, by the fact that his representation of those things does not get as far as being a representation at the intermediate level. That response is persuasive only if intermediateness is taken to figure alongside attention, as a part of the AIR theory's account of what it is that makes a content come to consciousness (for it is only then that a failure of intermediateness, by itself, could explain a lack of consciousness). This response is not available if the claim about intermediateness is read merely as an identification of which representations happen to have attended contents. The more ambitious reading therefore seems to be required at this point in Prinz's argument.
I think that this, which is only one component of Prinz's response to the case of GY, is best taken as a slip, and that the role of intermediateness in the AIR theory should be understood according to the modest reading, leaving the part of the theory that pertains to attention to do the work of explaining what it is that makes a representation's contents come to consciousness. Let us turn, therefore, to considering the attention-related parts of Prinz's theory.
When introducing the claim that 'attention gives rise to consciousness', Prinz acknowledges that 'to some ears' this 'sounds utterly uninformative' (p. 90). To the owners of such ears (ears not shared by the present reviewer), 'attention' and 'consciousness' seem to stand in an analytic relationship. Prinz attempts to address this complaint, and so to make his claim about attention and consciousness into a substantive one, by showing that there is no such analytic connection. Consciousness, he says, is defined by reference to the having of phenomenal qualities, whereas 'Attention can be defined without reference to phenomenal qualities' (p. 90).
It seems, initially, that this consciousness-independent definition of 'attention' is to be given by Prinz's claim that 'attention can be identified with the processes that allow information to be encoded in working memory' (p. 93), where 'working memory' is explained (following the orthodoxy that was established in psychology by the work of Alan Baddeley) as 'a short term storage capacity that allows for "executive control"' (p. 92, following Baddeley and Hitch, 1974).
If this were the end of the story then the story would be unsatisfactory, and the complaint of uninformative circularity would still be justified. It is of subjects, and not representations, that consciousness is primarily predicated. What it is for a representation to be conscious just is for that representation to have a conscious subject. No explanatory progress would be made by a theory telling us only that consciousness arises when some process takes place that makes the contents of a representation available to a conscious subject. The definition of attention by reference to 'working memory', where 'working memory' is explained by reference to 'executive control', can therefore avoid the problem of uninformativeness only if 'executive control' -- a technical term that clearly requires some sort of explication -- does not get its meaning from a definition that requires us to make mention of a conscious 'executive' subject.
The prospects of giving such a definition, although they are not hopeless, are not obviously good. It cannot be that 'executive control' is distinguished from other sorts of behaviour-influencing processes merely by reference to the fact that, in the case of executive control, a representation interacts with a creature's beliefs and desires to determine the way in which that creature behaves. Such an analysis (whether or not it avoids the presupposition of a conscious subject) would give the wrong results. To see this, consider the unilateral neglect patient who, when choosing between a picture of a house with flames coming out its left window and a picture of a house without such flames, consistently prefers the house without flames, despite being unable to see any difference between the two. (The case is discussed by Prinz on p. 82.) The flames must, it seems, be represented in the patient's brain. Their representation must be playing a role, in collaboration with the patient's beliefs and desires, in guiding her choices. We nonetheless want not to say that these representations are thereby implicated in the 'executive control' of those choices. If uninformative circularity is to be avoided here, Prinz needs there to be an account -- one that does not make reference to the role of a conscious subject -- of why this does not count as a case of 'executive control'.
It may be that such an account can be given -- perhaps by reference to the fact that the flames are represented in a way that influences the neglect patient's behaviour without facilitating any behaviour that is directed at the flames themselves -- but it is revealing that Prinz himself makes no attempt to give any such account. The most that he offers in this connection are some remarks associating executive control with 'reporting, deliberation and so on' (p. 95) (thus associating easy problems three and six with easy problems one, two, and five), but 'reporting' and 'deliberation' must both here be understood in a very liberal sense if it is to be a genuinely open question whether cephalopod working memory -- which surely does not facilitate very much reporting or deliberation -- produces consciousness (and Prinz suggests that this is an open question, on p. 343).
I have been suggesting that definitions of 'attention' that are given by reference to working memory, and so by reference to executive control, may not provide the consciousness-independent definition that is required if 'attention' is to figure in a genuinely informative account of consciousness. These difficulties are not yet an objection to anything that plays a substantive role in Prinz's theory. Prinz's lack of engagement with this problem should instead be taken as a sign that it is not here that the threat of circularity is met. The Baddeley definition of working memory serves merely to orient the reader. It is not this that provides Prinz with his consciousness-independent definition of 'attention'. Instead, Prinz hopes to give his independent characterization of attention by reference to 'working memory', where working memory is defined -- not with problematic references to the 'executive control' of 'deliberation' -- but in terms taken from systems of neuroscience.
The advantages of this move can be seen by considering Prinz's response to some recent work by David Soto, Teemu Mäntylä and Juha Silvanto; work purporting to show (what would be fatal to his theory) that it is possible for intermediate information to be made available to working memory without becoming conscious. Soto, Mäntylä, and Silvanto have shown that subjects are able to use information about the orientation of a masked stimulus, of which they have no conscious awareness, when forming a guess about whether a second stimulus, of which they are aware, is tilted relative to it. Soto, Mäntylä, and Silvanto interpret this as showing that the unseen stimulus is encoded in working memory. Prinz counters this suggestion by arguing that the masked stimulus is instead represented in 'fragile visual short term memory': a short term store which is thought to be independent of working memory, since different physical and psychological interventions disrupt it (Sligte et al. 2011). Prinz does not deny that the guesses made by Soto, Mäntylä, and Silvanto's experimental subjects are deliberate judgments, made under 'executive control'. Nor does he deny that information from the unseen stimuli is exerting an influence on such judgments. His position is to maintain that, despite being held in a short term store that enables it to influence deliberately made judgments, this information does not qualify as being in working memory:
The term "working memory" should not be used for [just] any short term storage capacity. It names a specific psychological system, whose properties and neural correlates have been extensively studied. The AIR theory defines consciousness in terms of attention and attention in terms of working memory, understood as a specific system. (p. 97)
It should be clear, then, that Prinz is not attempting to claim that any memory system that does appropriate behaviour-coordinating 'work' will support consciousness, when intermediate-level representations are made available to it (and this is why he does not need to give a non-question-begging account of what the work characteristic of working memory is). He is instead claiming that consciousness arises when intermediate-level representations are made available to memory systems of one particular natural kind: a 'neurofunctional' kind, with a real essence that includes both neurological and functional properties, so that 'trying to decide which is the true essence is foolish' (p. 287).
We have seen that Prinz relies on the neurological description of working memory (inter alia) to provide his non-circular identification of the processes that give rise to consciousness. Similarly low-level details also play a role in his final account of intermediateness. It is not intermediateness per se, but only intermediateness as our brains realize it (in the form of gamma 'vectorwaves'), that figures in his final presentation of the Attended Intermediate Representation theory. When that theory is 'fully unpacked' it tells us that:
Consciousness arises when and only when vectorwaves that realize intermediate-level representations fire in the gamma range, and thereby become available to [the particular neurofunctional kind of process that is] working memory. (p. 293)
This, as before, is susceptible to two different interpretations. On the stronger interpretation the theory's 'when and only when' claim is made true by the existence of an identity between the things mentioned on either side of it, such that the clauses on the right specify the real essence of the thing that is named on the left. (On this reading, the theory is comparable to: 'Digestion is the process whereby the nutritive part of food is rendered fit to be assimilated by the organism'. It tells us what consciousness is.)
On the metaphysically weaker interpretation, the 'when and only when' claim is made true by the fact that, in all actual and nearby cases, it is the thing mentioned on the right that realizes the thing mentioned on the left. In this case, although the clauses on the right must identify explanatory features, they need not identify essential ones. (The theory is then comparable to: 'Digestion happens when and only when enzymes from the pancreas act on the foodstuffs that have been broken down by the chemical and mechanical operation of the stomach'. It tells us how consciousness is done.)
Prinz presents the 'fully unpacked' version of the AIR theory as the conclusion of a chapter entitled 'What Is Consciousness?', and so he seems to have the identity-importing interpretation of the theory in mind. That interpretation is also indicated when he writes that:
Finding a level that maps onto quality space without remainder would be the best candidate for the level at which consciousness is located. Assuming that arguments for dualism fail, it would be the level at which we should make identity claims . . . I have suggested here that there is a neural level that fits this bill . . . I have also argued that these neurons play psychological roles that are essential for consciousness. (p. 289)
Most philosophers, since some time in the middle of the last century, have supposed that conscious states could be implemented in a creature with a very different neural apparatus. They have therefore supposed that the details of neural implementation do not belong in our claims about the identity of conscious states (whether or not those claims are accompanied, as in Prinz's treatment, by additional claims about essential psychological roles). Prinz rejects this line of thought. Elaborating on the empirical details of an argument that was first presented by Nick Zangwill (1992), he denies that the multiple-realizability of conscious states is a genuine possibility. The actual world, he argues, exhibits remarkably little variation in the ways in which particular mental states are realized, and the inferences required to support claims about the realization of such states in other possible worlds are laden with enough theory that, in the present context, they risk begging the question. Any intuitions that one might have about multiple-realizability are therefore moot enough for it to be unpersuasive to invoke such intuitions in an argument against Prinz's theory.
These points seem to defend the AIR theory against an objection that arises when that theory is construed as a claim about identity, and so as an answer to
The metaphysical question that has been at the heart of the mind-body problem in twentieth-century analytic philosophy . . . At which level of analysis should we specify the identity conditions of conscious mental states? (p. 272)
Later in this chapter, however, it becomes clear that it is not as a claim about the identity of conscious states that Prinz's theory should be construed. What Prinz really intends is the metaphysically less demanding interpretation of the AIR theory, according to which that theory makes a claim about the realization and explanation of conscious states, not about their identity or essence. To see this, we need to consider the modal force of Prinz's 'when and only when'.
Whatever they turn out to be, the realizers of consciousness will have innumerably many properties. Only some subset of these properties will play a role in making it the case that consciousness is realized. In order to give a 'satisfying . . . theory of how consciousness arises in the human brain' (p. 3), it is not enough to identify an arbitrary property of the consciousness-realizers. We need to identify properties that fall within the explanatorily relevant subset. Our usual tactic for gauging the explanatory relevance of a property is to consider some counterfactual conditionals pertaining to the bearer of that property. We suppose that property p is relevant to x's realization of F only if a counterpart of x that lacked p would not be F. It is in this way that modal enquiries figure in arguments about explanation.
Notice that in these arguments -- when we make modal enquiries for the purposes of assessing claims about explanatory relevance -- the closeness of the worlds that we are considering matters. A property, p, might pass the counterfactual test for explanatory relevance to x's being F, without it being the case that nothing could possibly realize F while lacking p. Consider the fact that the presence of duct tape can be explanatorily relevant to the structural integrity of some piece of furniture -- because the world in which we removed the duct tape would be a world in which the furniture collapsed -- without it being true that duct tape is a necessity for the structural integrity of furniture. To establish the explanatory relevance of the duct tape, it need only be that nearby duct-tape-lacking worlds have collapsing furniture.
In this respect, modal arguments about explanatory relevance should be contrasted with the modal arguments that we use when assessing claims about identity or essence. We assess these latter claims by asking whether there is any possible world in which a phenomenon is instantiated without the properties that are alleged to be essential to it, or identical with it. When we make modal enquiries for the purposes of assessing claims about identity, the closeness of the worlds that we are considering does not matter.
Prinz does not claim that the relation between consciousness and vectorwaves of gamma frequency holds across all possible worlds. He explicitly restricts himself to a claim about nearby worlds:
The link between gamma vectorwaves and attended intermediate-level representations is neither metaphysically nor nomologically necessary. But it is a counterfactual supporting connection. (p. 279)
His theory should therefore be interpreted as a claim about explanation and realization, not as a claim about identity and essence. It is in this way, as a piece of mechanism-specifying explanation (of the sort that has been characterized by Machamer, Darden and Craver, 2000) that Prinz finally suggests his theory should be understood.
It does not diminish the philosophical importance of the AIR theory to insist that, when understood in this way, it should not be mistaken for a theory about identity or essence. But this reading of Prinz's theory does entail that his rejection of multiple realizability, his talk of 'neural essences' (p. 290), and some of his hedged remarks about the conscious properties of 'a given gamma vectorwave . . . in every possible world in which it occurs' (p. 286), are stronger than he really needs. It also means -- since this is an explanatory theory that nonetheless acknowledges 'an explanatory gap between phenomenal experience and physical descriptions' (p. 289) -- that there are some hard problems that remain before a theory such as Prinz's can be said to have addressed 'the metaphysical question that has been at the heart of the mind-body problem in twentieth-century analytic philosophy' (p. 272). This book should only be taken as one contribution to our ongoing attempts to address that question, but the contribution it makes is a unique and valuable one.
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