2018.11.15

Plotinus

The Enneads

Plotinus, The Enneads, Lloyd P. Gerson (ed.), George Boys-Stones, John M. Dillon, Lloyd P. Gerson, R. A. H. King, Andrew Smith, and James Wilberding (trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2018, 931pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107001770.

Reviewed by Sara Magrin, University of California, Berkeley


This is the first complete translation into English of Plotinus' Enneads since Armstrong's currently standard translation for the Loeb Classical Library (1966-1988). Like Armstrong's translation, this new translation is based on the Greek text established by P. Henry and H.-R­­. Schwyzer in their editio minor of the Enneads, and it is undeniably a major achievement. Although the team whose work it is points out that it is not meant to replace the Loeb translation, it has clear and significant advantages over the latter.[1] First, it is based on a superior Greek text, for it takes into account all the corrections introduced by Henry and Schwyzer in the third volume of their editio minor and in subsequent work. Second, it reports almost all the references listed in the editio minor, while also adding to them a considerable number of cross-references. Third, it is very often more readable than Armstrong's translation, and, being in one volume (without the facing Greek text) rather than in seven, it is much easier to consult. While the non-specialist will probably prefer to use this new translation, specialists and graduate students will welcome it as a much-needed alternative to that of Armstrong, and they will, I think, greatly benefit from a close comparison with the latter.

The comparison will prove useful because there are some important differences between the two translations. In general, the team's translation is less literal than Armstrong's, and it also aims to be more consistent. Thus, while Armstrong tends to translate word by word, often leaving it to the reader to sort out the exact meaning of a sentence, the team tends to disambiguate and to opt for a precise reading. Furthermore, while Armstrong tends to translate the same terms in different ways according to context, the team prefers consistency, to the point that the particle ê, which Plotinus uses to tentatively introduce his solution to an aporia -- and which means roughly "is it not the case that . . . ?" -- is almost always rendered by "in fact", rather than left, for the most part, untranslated, as is Armstrong's practice.

The team's choices have, in my view at least, pros and cons, which I will try to illustrate by examining some well-known controversial passages. As the Enneads are hardly a work one reads cover to cover, I will organize my observations thematically, dealing first with the treatises on psychology, then, more briefly, with those on physics, and, finally, with those on epistemology and metaphysics.

The first treatise of the Enneads, Enn., 1.1, is, according to most scholars, crucial for our understanding of Plotinus' psychology, and there are several places here where at least my understanding of the Greek text differs from that of the team. In Enn., 1.1 Plotinus tries to defend one of his most controversial theses, namely that our soul never entirely "descends" into our body -- as a "superficial" interpretation of Plato's middle dialogues might suggest -- but rather animates it through a "trace" or "shadow" of itself. While defending this thesis, Plotinus engages in what seems to be a sustained criticism of Aristotle's conception of the soul as the actuality of a certain kind of body, that is, an organic body having life potentially (Aristot. De an., 2.1, 412a 27-b1). Echoing Aristotle (De an., 1.4, 408b 1-5), Plotinus begins by asking what is the proper subject of emotions, desires, perceptions, and thoughts. In Armstrong's translation, the first two lines of the treatise read as follows: "Pleasures and sadnesses (lupai), fears and assurances, desires and aversions and pain (to algein) -- whose are they?" The plural "sadnesses" might strike the reader as odd, but this translation conveys Plotinus' distinction here between lupai on the one hand, and to algein on the other. Lupai, in this context, are feelings of mental distress as opposed to the physical pain signified by to algein (cf., e.g., Enn., 4.7.7.1-2, and the team's translation of those lines). The team, at first, seems to just invert the meanings as it renders lupai by "pain" and to algein by "feelings of distress". Later, however, at Enn., 1.1.2.21, the team's translation suggests that the terms lupai and to algein are used interchangeably, while they are not, since they refer to two distinct mental phenomena, as Armstrong saw (note that the "for" appearing in the team's translation of line 21 has no correspondence in the Greek text).

A more literal translation of the whole second chapter of Enn., 1.1 might have been, in my view at least, preferable. Having introduced, in chapter 1, the topic of the subject of emotions, perceptions, and thoughts, in chapter 2 Plotinus turns to the nature of the soul itself, and wonders whether the soul is such that it could "admit" or, more literally, "receive" (dechesthai) emotions at all. It might indeed be odd in English to speak of the soul as something that may or may not "admit" or "receive" emotions, but the team's choice of rendering dechesthai by "being the subject of" might obscure the distinction between the topic of chapter 1 and that of chapter 2; Armstrong's translation of chapter 2 does not raise this issue. We find another case where the team opts for a translation which is substantially different from that of Armstrong in chapter 7. Plotinus there makes an important observation about perception, for he claims that the perceptual power (dunamis) of the soul ou tôn aisthêtôn einai dei, tôn de apo tês aisthêseôs engignomenôn tôi zôiôi typôn antilêptikên einai mallon (Enn., 1.1.7.9-11). Armstrong translates thus:

need not be perception of sense-objects, but rather it must be receptive of the impressions produced by sensation on the living being.

This is, to my mind, a faithful translation which rests on a natural construal of the Greek text, even if the adjective antilêptikên does not mean "receptive", but rather "capable of apprehending". The team opts for a different construal, however, and renders the sentence thus:

should not be understood as being of sensibles, but rather of the impressions that arise from sense-perception and which are graspable by the living being.

Here "which are graspable" translates antilêptikên, but while the latter (an accusative feminine) refers to the perceptual power of the soul, the team seems to take it to refer to the impressions arising from perception (typôn, a genitive masculine). This is a difficult construal, and it is not easy to see what Plotinus might mean by saying that the soul perceives the perceptual impressions "which are graspable by the living being".

Enn., 1.1.7 is also a place where the team's choice to translate single words more or less consistently throughout the treatises might, perhaps, be called into question. The team renders consistently the Greek word eikôn by "image", while it prefers "reflection" for eidôlon. Thus, when at Enn., 1.1.7.12 Plotinus claims that the perception of external objects is an eidôlon of the inner perception of forms which takes place within the soul itself, the team writes that the perception of external objects is "a reflection" of the soul's inner perception. This translation is perfectly legitimate, but it is not easy to understand in what sense the perception of an external object could be "a reflection" of another kind of perception. Had the team opted for rendering eidôlon by "image" in this context, the meaning of the sentence, I think, would have been clearer. For Plotinus' point here seems to be that the soul's perception of external objects is, in a way, similar to the soul's inner perception of forms, while falling short of the latter in its epistemic value. This is a point which would have been more easily conveyed by the term "image". By calling the soul's perception of external objects "a reflection" of the soul's inner perception of forms, the team seems to suggest, instead, that, for Plotinus, there can be no perception of external objects without a previous inner perception of forms. Perhaps this is indeed what Plotinus is trying to say here, but it does not seem obvious to me.

Analogous remarks can be made about Enn., 3.6.1-5. When it takes the term aisthêsis to mean an actual perception as opposed to the capacity of perception, the team tends to render it by "act of perception". In principle, this is a sound choice, but sometimes one would have hoped for more flexibility. Thus, in Enn., 3.6.1.1 Plotinus claims that aisthêseis are not passive affections but rather activities of the soul, and then goes on to justify this claim. If one here renders aisthêseis by "acts of perception", as the team does, it will seem obvious to a reader with no Greek that they are activities rather than passive affections, and this reader will wonder, I think, why there is any need to look into this point at all. Likewise, the team's choice to render almost always phantasia by "semblance", rather than by the more ordinary "impression" or "representation", occasionally raises a problem. Thus, for instance, at Enn., 3.6.4.21, where Plotinus speaks of a anepikritos phantasia, the team translates "uncritical semblance". It is far from clear what Plotinus means by an anepikritos phantasia, but, roughly, he seems to use the term phantasia to mean a sensory impression or a sensory representation, just as Aristotle and the Stoics did before him. Insofar as the term "semblance" evokes a copy-model relation, which is, if not foreign to, at least not prominent in, the Aristotelian and Stoic meaning of phantasia, that term, in my view at least, adds a level of complexity to the interpretation of the text which might not be warranted.

When we turn to Plotinus' most sustained discussion of the soul and its capacities, namely Enn., 4.3 and Enn., 4.4, we find that the word-choices are consistent with those of Enn., 1.1 and 3.6, but now fit the context in a more natural way. There are of course points at which one could have opted for a different construal of the Greek, but the translation of Enn. 4.3 and, especially, 4.4 is often, in my view, a clear improvement over that of Armstrong, both because it is more readable and because it sometimes yields a better sense. Compare, for instance, the translations of Enn., 4.3.19.5-8. There Plotinus examines Plato's account of the creation of the soul at Timaeus, 35a 1-3, and he asks how one is to interpret Plato's claim that the soul is made of both "divisible" and "indivisible" constituents. Armstrong translates Enn., 4.3.19.5-8 in the following way:

This could be answered when it has been understood what we mean by each. The term "indivisible" is used without qualification, but "divisible" is not unqualified but Plato says that soul "becomes divisible in the sphere of bodies", and not that it has already become so.

The team translate thus:

This question may be resolved by grasping clearly what we mean by each of these terms. Now Plato uses the term "indivisible" unqualifiedly, but "divisible" with a qualification; he says that the soul becomes "divisible among bodies", implying thus that it has not antecedently been divided.

It seems evident to me that the team's translation conveys Plotinus' remarks more clearly and more accurately.

As for the treatises on physics, since two topics in Plotinus' physics have received a great deal of attention recently, namely his account of matter, and his account of eternity and time, I will deal primarily with the team's translation of Enn., 2.4, his treatise on matter, and Enn., 3.7, his treatise on time and eternity. The team's translation of Enn., 2.4, just like its translation of Enn., 4.3 and Enn., 4.4, is overall more readable and accurate than Armstrong's, though also in this case consistency sometimes seems to be favored over clarity. Let us consider Enn., 2.4.1.7, where Plotinus introduces the Stoic view that only bodies are beings and matter is their foundation. This is a view which Plotinus tries to refute time and again in his discussions of matter, and which readers need to grasp in order to understand how Plotinus arrives at his own conception of what matter is. At Enn., 2.4.1.7 the Greek runs as follows: kai hoi men sômata monon ta onta einai themenoi kai tên ousian en toutois. Armstrong translates: "Those who adopt the position that realities are exclusively bodies and that substance consists in bodies". The rendering of ta onta by "realities" is misleading, because it suggests, wrongly, that for the Stoics only bodies are real, whereas, for them, only bodies are "beings", while incorporeals, though falling short of the status of "beings", are, nonetheless, also real things. The team avoids this confusion and translates thus: "Those men [the Stoics] who posit only bodies as beings and that substantiality is to be found among these bodies". Although more accurate in some respects, the team's translation seems to me to needlessly complicate the philosophical point. The team chooses to translate ousia by "substantiality" to make clear that ousia here does not mean "essence", yet the translation that this choice yields might be confusing, for Plotinus' point is just, as Armstrong's puts it, that substance (or being) does not consist in bodies. However, when we turn to Enn., 2.4.14, where Plotinus begins to introduce his account of matter as "privation" (sterêsis) by criticizing the Peripatetic account of matter as something distinct from privation, the advantages of the team's translation over Armstrong's translation are, once again, clear. For the team's translation consistently avoids Armstrong's, in my view, incorrect assimilation of privation in that chapter to "non-existence", namely to absolute non-being.

Similarly, when we look at Enn., 3.7, Plotinus' treatise on eternity and time, we find at least one substantial improvement over Armstrong's translation, which is crucial for a correct understanding of the text. In Enn., 3.7.9 Plotinus examines Aristotle's definition of time as "the number of motion in respect to before and after" (Phys., 4.11, 219b 1-2). As Steven Strange has shown in an influential study, in that chapter, Plotinus, like Alexander of Aphrodisias before him, wonders as to whether the number Aristotle mentions in his definition of time is to be identified with the number of the objects counted (e.g., ten as in "ten horses") or with a "numbering" number corresponding to some abstract unit.[2] In Physics 4, Aristotle seems to suggest that time is to be identified with the former, but Alexander argued that it had to be the latter. Plotinus accepts Alexander's interpretation, and, on the grounds of it, raises an objection against Aristotle's definition of time. If time is the number of motion in respect to before and after, in the sense that it is the "numbering" number of this motion, then, he wonders, why is this number supposed to produce a specifically temporal sequence, rather than any sort of sequence? This objection, in the team's translation is rendered as follows: "But then the number that measures in terms of before and after (all' oun kata to proteron kai hysteron metrôn), whether it does so by a point or by anything else, will in any case be measuring according to time" (3.7.9.57-59). This translation not only reveals what the discussion is about, that is, that it is about an interpretation of time as numbering, or measuring, number, but also conveys the sense of Plotinus' objection to it. In light of Strange's study, the team correctly identifies the subject of the participle metrôn with the number mentioned in the previous lines, whereas Armstrong, in contrast, takes the subject of the participle to be a person who happens to measure by "before and after", and thus fails to convey, if not the sense, at least the exegetical context on which Plotinus' discussion rests.

My impression of the translation of the treatises on epistemology and metaphysics is in line with my previous remarks. The translation is often clearer and more accurate than Armstrong's, and the specialist will want to compare them. Consider, for instance, Enn., 5.3.1-4, one of the loci classici for the reconstruction of Plotinus' epistemology. The team, correctly in my view, rejects one of Armstrong's sometimes problematic emendations of the Greek text (at 5.3.1.17), but then renders the technical expression sunagon kai diairoun (5.3.2.9), which is generally translated as "combining and dividing", by "organizing and distinguishing". This translation is perfectly legitimate, and it is one which, probably, non-specialists will find more appealing; it does not, however, convey the fact that Plotinus alludes here to Platonic dialectic, in the context of which "combination" and "division" are technical terms. Enn., 5.3.1-4 is also a place where one can see a problem with the team's decision to translate the particle ê by "in fact" in order to signal that Plotinus is introducing the solution of an aporia. For "in fact" at 5.3.1.5 seems at first to translate ê, and thus seems to introduce the solution of an aporia, whereas it actually translates gar, and is meant to introduce a reason for the statement which precedes it in the text. Out of line with its general practice, the team, in this treatise, does not consistently translate ê by "in fact", but chooses, for the most part, to give an interrogative form to the sentences introduced by it. I actually find this choice preferable, not least because it conveys the open-endedness of Plotinus' inquiries, and the tentative nature of his solutions to philosophical aporiai, but this choice here comes as a surprise, and, in my view at least, it would have been more appropriate in other contexts (see, esp., Enn., 4.4.2).

The problem of how to render technical terms and expressions is particularly acute when one tries to grapple with Plotinus' long treatise On the Genera of Being. I will focus on Enn., 6.1, the first part of that treatise. In Enn., 6.1 Plotinus criticizes both the Aristotelian and the Stoic accounts of the categories. One of the main interpretive issues it raises concerns the way in which Plotinus conceives of Aristotle's categories, whether, that is, he conceives of them as classifications of beings or, alternatively, of words. Even though everybody grants that the term "category" means "predicate", most scholars today tend to think that Plotinus viewed Aristotle's categories as classifications of beings rather than of words.[3] Rather than rendering the Greek term katêgoria simply by "category", leaving it to the reader to sort out its precise meaning, the team renders it by "predicate". This is a legitimate choice, but one which has, I think, important consequences. Let us consider one of the key passages, namely 6.1.1.17. Here Plotinus wonders whether the Peripatetics speak of "ten genera (genê)" or of "ten katêgoriai". The nature of this distinction has been much debated in the literature. However, in light of what we read in 6.1.3.1-12 and 6.1.9.25-32, it does not seem to be a distinction between genera and predicates, as the team's translation by "ten predicates" suggests, but seems, rather, to be a distinction between two ways of classifying beings or things that are, one of which rests on genera, while the other rests on what Plotinus views as a "looser" kind of class, which he calls "category". The team might agree with this reading, for it might agree that predicates are viewed here as labels for classes of things, but its translation does not seem to me to convey this point; for the term "predicate" in English does not immediately suggest that what is meant by it is a class. Analogous remarks hold for the non-standard rendering, in Enn., 6.1.25, of the expressions used by the Stoics to designate their so-called categories.

Another place where perhaps a more neutral translation might have been preferable is Enn., 6.5.7.4-6. Here Plotinus makes a crucial, but very problematic, claim concerning our cognitive relation to the intelligible objects in Nous, i.e., on his interpretation, the Forms. First he observes (6.5.7.3) that we do not think of these objects by having "images" (eidôla) or "imprints" (tupoi) of them in ourselves, and then he claims that, if we do have a share in knowledge, it is by being the intelligibles themselves ouk apolabontes auta en hêmin, all' hêmeis en ekeinois ontes (6.5.7.5-6). A natural translation of this phrase would be "not by taking them into ourselves, but rather by ourselves being in them".[4] The team, however, following Armstrong, renders the phrase by "without separating them off in ourselves, since, on the contrary, we are in them". Even if the verb apolambanô from which the participle apolabontes derives can indeed mean, in some contexts, "to separate off", this does not seem to be one of those contexts, since here the verb seems to be used to introduce a contrast between receiving intelligible objects from Nous, and thus knowing them via impressions (or "imprints"), and becoming Nous by sharing directly in its knowledge. This passage is problematic because what Plotinus says here does not seem to be consistent with his remark elsewhere (Enn., 5.3.3.11-12) that we do receive within our soul "traces" or "imprints" from Nous. Perhaps the team chose to render ouk apolabontes by "without separating off" so as to avoid committing Plotinus to an apparent inconsistency, but maybe the reader should be the ultimate judge on this matter.

To conclude, I have tried to compare the team's translation of some particularly difficult passages with that of Armstrong to highlight the main differences between the two, but I hope to have shown that this new translation will be not only extremely useful and enjoyable for the general reader, but indispensable for specialists and graduate students working on Plotinus and, more broadly, on ancient philosophy.


[1] Here and in what follows I refer to "the team" or "the team's translation" because, even if different treatises were assigned to different people, all translations are credited to the team rather than to individual members of it.

[2] S. K. Strange, "Plotinus on the Nature of Eternity and Time", in L. P. Schrenk (ed.), Aristotle in Late Antiquity, Catholic University of America Press, 1994, pp. 22-53

[3] See, esp., R. Chiaradonna, Sostanza Movimento Analogia, CNR, 2002.

[4] This is the translation one finds in Plotinus, Ennead VI.4 & VI.5, translation, introduction, and commentary by E. K. Emilsson and S. K. Strange, Parmenides Publishing, 2015.