Few concepts have generated more discussion in more academic disciplines and sub-disciplines than the concept of the "self." The idea of sandwiching between the covers of a book a representation of contemporary research on the self from philosophy of mind, metaphysics, phenomenology, narrative theory, moral philosophy, theories of agency, postmodern perspectives, Buddhist studies, feminist thought, cognitive science, developmental psychology, abnormal psychology, social psychology, psychiatry, and neuroscience sounds like more than one could chew. It is remarkable that Shaun Gallagher has managed to dish up such a satisfying work in The Oxford Handbook of the Self. Upon finishing the work, I could hardly move from the table. However, the concoction lacks a distinct flavor that this patron expected to find.
This 745-page tome consists of 31 articles by leading scholars in philosophy and psychology. Most appear to have been written specifically for this volume, which aims "to introduce the reader to the complexity of the concept (or plurality of concepts) [of the self] and the many different approaches to its (their) analysis" (p. 2, brackets added). These approaches fall into three main categories of analysis: experiential (What is the experience of the self like?), ontological (Does the self exist, and if so, what kind of thing or process is it?), and social (How do our relations with others constitute or construct the self?). There are very strong flavors of phenomenology, experimental psychology, and how conscious relations to others affect the self. However, there is not much metaphysics on the plate. Serious representation of contemporary versions of dualism as a theory of the self or person and discussion of how the problem of qualia may complicate an understanding of the self are simply and unfortunately absent from the anthology.
Most of the articles serve to summarize current research on particular questions about the self, as one would expect in a good handbook. They are well written and most are accessible to non-specialists. Many contain clear summaries, along with extensive bibliographies that are helpful departure points for readers wishing to explore further. While the contributors do not directly discuss each other's articles, there are helpful editorial cross-references in the text to appreciate some of the important connections. References in many of the articles to Descartes, Hume, Kant, Husserl, James, Mead, and Sartre also help to keep one's bearings when navigating through the work.
Following Gallagher's introductory chapter, the work is divided into seven parts: I. Self: Beginnings and Basics; II. Bodily Selves; III. Phenomenology and Metaphysics of Self; IV. Personal Identity, Narrative Identity, and Self Knowledge; V. Action and the Moral Dimension of the Self; VI. Self Pathologies; VII.The Self in Diverse Contexts.
Part I begins with a brief historical survey of the notions of self and person by psychologist John Barresi, and philosopher Raymond Martin, and frames the ontological scope of the collection. Substantive views of the self, as found, for example, in Descartes, were swept away by science in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, and, as noted above, are absent from the work. The essays in general assume that it is illusory to think of the self as a substantive entity. Still, Barresi and Martin conclude that even though modern analysis appears to yield a very fragmented and illusory notion of the self, "the notion of the self is too important for personal and social purposes to just go away" (p. 55). The challenge is to consider how to best integrate diverse thoughts about the self. There thus remains the possibility of theorizing about the self in terms of some integrated qualities of the body, experience, narrative identity, morality, and social relations. Missing, however, is consideration of whether it makes sense to posit the self as a substantive entity precisely in order to account for the unity of those qualities.
The next three articles review the current state of knowledge on several topics and research programs. In "What Is It Like to Be a Newborn?" Phillipe Rochat provides an informative review from developmental psychology for thinking that infants at birth, and possibly before,
manifest minimal self-awareness: a sense of themselves as differentiated and situated entities among other entities in the world . . . of being embodied and substantial, occupying space in an environment in which they are agent, . . . infused with meaning arising from interaction with others. (p. 76)
This interpersonal and ecological (Neiser) sense of self, Rochat suggests, arises from innate mechanisms that attune infants to what is the same in their successive embodied experiences.
In "Self Recognition," Gordon Gallup, James Anderson, and Steven Platek summarize neurophysiological research on the ability to become the object of one's own awareness in human and other species. (In 1970 Gallup presented the first experimental report of mirror self-recognition in chimpanzees). The article contains an extensive bibliography for anyone wishing to research this topic further.
In "Self in the Brain," Kai Vogeley and Shaun Gallagher review neuroscientific research on the self, concluding that "it looks like the entire cortex is specialized for self-referential processing, or, in other words, . . . there is no specialized or common area responsible for self-related representations" (p. 116). They endorse Daniel Dennett's warning that "it's a category mistake to start looking around for [selves] in the brain" (pp. 129-130) and suggest that neuroscientists study "what happens in the brain when the self-as-subject is engaged in the world, in specific actions and in specific social contexts" (p. 130).
Part II focuses on how bodily processes contribute to the self. In "The Embodied Self" Quassim Cassam asks three questions: (1) What is the relation of body to the self? (2) What is the nature of the awareness each of us has of his or her own body from the inside? (3) Is there anything special about our knowledge of our own bodies, such as their being immune to error by misidentification? Following Gareth Evans, Cassam holds that bodily self-ascriptions based on proprioception (the direct, non-inferential awareness of where one's limbs are) are immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun. Cassam also defends the view that since perception and cognition are necessarily embodied and the self is what perceives, thinks, and acts, the self is necessarily embodied.
José Luis Bermúdez's "Bodily Awareness and Self-consciousness" offers a taxonomy of bodily-relative information - a useful map for navigating the phenomenological terrain of different forms of bodily awareness, how they relate to the sense of "ownership" of one's body, and what may or may not be immune to error through misidentification. Bermúdez concludes by identifying two ways in which bodily awareness counts as a form of self-consciousness. First, it "provides a direct experiential way of grasping the structure and limits of the embodied self and thus the boundary between the self and the non-self" (p. 177). Second, because some forms of bodily awareness are directly involved with the control of action, it "presents the body as a unique physical object directly responsible to the will" (p. 177).
Manos Tsakiris's "The Sense of Bodily Ownership," continues the discussion of what it is that makes experience of one's body one's own. In contrast to Bermudez, Tsakiris believes that there is a special phenomenal quality that makes bodily sensations unique to oneself, the feeling that "my body" belongs to me. He focuses on what can be learned about body ownership from experiments involving the Rubber Hand Illusion. Insofar as the experience of bodily ownership may be essential to the nature of the self, this experiment is a promising avenue of research for how sensory input is integrated with internal representations of the body to create the self.
A phenomenological approach continues in the next article by Dorothée Legrand. Legrand distinguishes awareness of the "self-as-object" from the "self-as-subject." She aims to show how the subjective aspect of consciousness is "both constitutive and constituted by intentionality" (p. 208) in bodily self-consciousness. Her account of bodily self-consciousness is extremely rich. Essentially, she links subjective and intentional consciousness by arguing that the experience of oneself as a subject involves the experience of being oriented towards intentional objects from a first-person perspective and of being in contact with those objects through one's bodily feelings. The self can be experienced as a subject while it is being experienced through its bodily dimensions of taking up space and having location and orientation in the world. More broadly, Legrand is attempting to addresses Husserl's "paradox of subjectivity," i.e., how we can be both a subject for the world and at the same time an object in the world (p. 209).
"Witnessing from Here: Self-awareness from a Bodily versus Embodied Perspective" by Aaron Henry and Evan Thompson provides an excellent analysis of how the phenomenological considerations in earlier chapters bear on the question of whether the self is real. The critical question is whether the phenomenological analysis supports believing in the reality of the self or whether the analysis shows that the self is an illusion. The article is very helpful to getting one's bearings on the relationship and points of disagreement among various authors in the collection.
Henry and Thomson discuss Mira Albahari's rejection of the Cartesian substantive view of the self and defense of the Buddhist view that the self is a fictional construct. While they also reject the Cartesian view, they challenge Albahari's claim that there is no reality to the self. In their view and in agreement with Cassam, Bermudez, and Legrand, the phenomenological analysis reveals a self given as a bodily subject in experience. Henry and Thomson argue that in order to account for perspectival experience, there must be a bodily perspective from which the experience originates and that the "no-self" or "nonegological" view fails to account for such experience. Moreover, along lines similar to Legrand, they argue that bodily self-awareness is intransitive and given in experience, rather than being an object of experience. This bodily self-awareness provides a basic understanding of the self as distinct from the other.
Galen Strawson also rejects the idea that the self is an illusion or fiction. He thinks that "experience is impossible without an experiencer [what he calls a "minimal subject"]" (p. 253, brackets added). While talk of an "experiencer" may suggest a thing, object, or substance of some kind, Strawson distances himself from any such ontological commitment. Indeed, he accepts that all things, objects, and substances are best thought of as processes. A thing, object, or substance, he proposes, is just for a unity of a certain kind to obtain -- "a strong activity-unity" without any implication of intentional agency. Since he further assumes that physicalism (every concrete phenomenon in this universe is physical) is true, the minimal subject must be physical. Here, he cautions that we should not contrast the physical with what is experiential and seek to reduce experience to some non-experiential account or eliminate it entirely. Instead, he takes a more expansive view of the physical to include what it is like to experience things: "there must be more to the physical than we thought, for experience is real and must be wholly physical if materialism is true" (p. 257).
Strawson's "minimal subject" is indeed minimal. Whereas Cassam, Bermudez, Legrand, Tsakiris, and Henry and Thompson view the body as constitutive of the self, Strawson's minimal subject is constituted only by experience and thus exists only when there is experiencing. There is no subject that continues to exist when there is no experience, e.g., when a human being is asleep or unconscious. Moreover, the subject has no dispositional being; it is only "live" when it is experiencing. It thus exists episodically for some short amount of time. Finally, there is no reason to identify a minimal subject at one time with a minimal subject at a later time. Thus, Strawson concludes
If there are constant, short, unnoticed gaps in the experience of an ordinary human being during the normal waking day . . . then the existence of a human being during a normal waking day involves the existence of many thin or minimal subjects, although we (or most of us) normally think of it as involving the existence of a single continuing subject. (p. 262)
Strawson's "thin subject" contrasts with many of the "thick" conceptions of the self in which the body, environment, and social relations are constitutive of the self. While Strawson admits that in addition to being subjects there is some sense in which we are human beings that last longer than minimal subjects, it is unclear in the end what "I" is supposed to refer to and how the minimal subject is related to a more robust, thicker sense of the self. In a contribution later in the book, Marya Schectman is critical of Strawson's view on this point and suggests that we have narrative histories that make us much more than Strawson's minimal subjects. In fact, this type of disagreement may reflect differences in why we are interested in the self in the first place and how our framing of the inquiry into the self may in part define the kind of acceptable answers that we can expect from our inquiry. For example, if we are interested in questions about the self to answer questions about moral responsibility or which beings may be a locus of value, then it is hard to see how Strawson's view could be a satisfactory answer.
In the "No-Self Alternative," Tom Metzinger argues that there is "no empirical evidence and no truly convincing conceptual argument that supports the actual existence of 'a' self" (p. 279). Traditional substantive views of the self are thrown out along with other "substances" on grounds that they have no place in contemporary physical theory as basic building blocks of reality. No matter how intuitively certain we may be about the phenomenology of the self, phenomenology does not determine metaphysics. Indeed, Metzinger suggests that, even if we cannot imagine the world without selves from a first-person perspective, that may be explained by a contingent fact about the causal structure of our brains.
Metzinger thinks that positing the self as an unknowable substance (a theoretical entity) necessary to make sense of our observable behavior or the introspective phenomenology of selfhood is at odds with thinking that there is direct experience of the self. If selves have an unknowable intrinsic nature, then "in introspection and phenomenal self-awareness, we never grasp our own true nature" (p.284). However, it is not clear why the phenomenal self-awareness cannot yield real aspects of the self, even if the self is a theoretical entity. In addition, it is puzzling why Metzinger seems to assume that the only reasons we have for positing the self would be in the context of a scientific research program. Selves are also posited in ethical and political theories. Why think that they can be dispensed with there? Can we make sense of our moral experience without positing the reality of selves? This issue is explored in Part V.
In chapter 12, Mark Siderits provides an excellent overview of different views about the self in the Buddhist tradition. Some "Buddhist Personalists" believe that there is no self, but in order to account for moral responsibility, they hold that the person is no mere conceptual fiction. Siderits suggests that they hold a form of emergentism in which the person is neither identical nor distinct from its elements, but that it somehow exists separate from its elements. Siderits also discusses objections to the no-self view, particularly one that comes from the phenomenological camp. How, the opponent asks, can it seem to me that I am a person if there is no "me" for whom the things seem this way?" (pp. 308-309). Buddhist Reductionists respond by holding that "experience across different sensory modalities involves distinct consciousnesses" (p. 309). Seeing a mango is a different consciousness from tasting it. There is nothing that unifies these experiences. Because the experiencing "subject" exists momentarily and episodically, it is entirely impersonal in nature.
In the next selection, "Unity of Consciousness and the Problem of the Self," Don Zahavi challenges this Buddhist position (e.g., Albahari) by arguing that a person's multisensory experiences have the common feature that they are her experiences. Denial of this view, according to Zahavi, "would entail that my own mind is either not given to me at all -- I would be mind- or self-blind -- or present to me in exactly the same way as the minds of others" (p. 327).
This point also serves as a basis for Zahavi to critique Strawson's claim that there is nothing that makes experiences over periods of unconsciousness (e.g., a nap or coma) experiences of the same self. Zahavi agrees with Strawson and Albahari that what makes these diachronic experiences belong to the same self is not some underlying substance. Instead, it is their mineness or first-personal character: "experiential (diachronic and synchronic) unity is constituted by first-personal character" (p. 329).
Zahavi notes rightly that such a phenomenological feature of the self will be limited in what it can explain or account for, since over time someone might lose the first-personal character of an earlier experience, e.g., through memory loss, yet we would still think that the experience belongs to the same self or person. He suggests that we therefore need to adopt a "multilayered account" of the self: "We are more than experiential core selves, we are for instance also narratively configured socialized persons. And we continue to remain so even when non-conscious" (p. 329 fn. 9). Zahavi applies this thinking in response to possible objections from Harry Frankfurt or Charles Taylor that the minimal experiential self that he and others have engaged in phenomenological heroics to save is either non-existent or inconsequential. Zahavi accepts the idea that we are the kind of robust or thick selves that Frankfurt identifies by defining persons by second order volitions or that Taylor defines by their existence in a normative space. However, he argues that such beings could not exist without a core experiential self. To this reviewer, Zahavi's suggestion, echoed later by Marya Schectman, to integrate a phenomenological first-personal character of experience into a more robust, multilayered theory of the self that takes into account the self's narrative, social, and normative nature is about the most sensible point in the entire book.
Part IV, "Personal Identity, Narrative Identity, and Self Knowledge" consists of four articles that go beyond the earlier phenomenological approaches that focus mainly on the self as experienced at a particular time and investigate the nature of the self over an extended period of time. In short, what makes us the same self or person over time?
John Campbell focuses on two main problems of personal identity. The first arises from the assumptions that (1) for personal identity over time there must be some "immanent causation" linking the person at an earlier stage to the person at a later stage and (2) there must be some mechanism that accounts for the causal connection. Campbell worries about how we are to make sense of such a causal mechanism in hypothetical cases like Locke's Prince and Cobbler swapping bodies. Since there is presumably no physical continuity between the Prince and Cobbler, do we need to posit the persistence of the soul as a kind of "non-physical para-mechanical mechanism" to account for the identity of the Cobbler in the Prince's body? If not a soul, perhaps "some-fine grained physical mechanisms at work, mediating between the earlier psychological states of the Cobbler and the later psychological states of the Prince" (p. 349)? The second problem concerns whether the "I" (person or self) is eliminable, as Derek Parfit and others have suggested. On this score, Campbell sides with John Perry against the eliminability of the self on grounds that it is essential for the explanation of action and responsibility. An impersonal description of an action would never give any reason for why one should feel responsible for an action.
Sydney Shoemaker in "On What We Are" takes up the problem of the nature of the "immanent causation" that accounts for personal identity over time. He suggests that the kind of causation at work depends on the kind of thing something is, and that the kind of thing something is depends on the kind of "thick properties" that it can have. Against the animalist view, Shoemaker argues that the thick properties of persons are psychological. This article provides an excellent summary of Shoemaker's influential view of persons, especially how his rejection of animalism in favor of the idea that persons are constituted by animals underlies his account of personal identity.
In "On Knowing One's Self" John Perry explains how "I" functions in self-referential expressions, how it is immune to error through misidentification, and how it, like other indexicals, such as "here" and "now," refers in a way that does not require additional intentions or further criteria to be met in order to refer to oneself, as is the case with proper names and descriptions. Perry claims that we need neither posit the existence of Cartesian egos, nor deny the existence of the self, in order to make sense of our use of the first-person pronoun. Rather, we simply need to appreciate that the way "I" refers to the self is different from the way other non-indexical expressions refer. What is missing from the article is how Perry connects this more synchronic account of how "I" refers to a diachronic account of personal identity, an account which Perry has developed in other work.
Although Perry, himself, does not connect his semantic analysis with a phenomenological analysis of the self, as offered in earlier chapters, his account of first-person reference and commitment to physicalism may serve as a bridge between approaches to the self in the phenomenological tradition and those in the philosophy of language. There may be important connections between the functional role that the self plays in fixing the reference of "I" and the givenness of the bodily self in subjective experience.
In "The Narrative Self" Marya Schechtman provides an overview of the similarities and differences in narrative theories of the self, including those of Alasdair MacIntyre, Charles Taylor, Paul Ricouer, Daniel Dennett, Katherine Nelson, David Velleman, and her own. Because the concepts that we use to interpret our lives are derived from the cultural context in which we are embedded, we are social selves. In Taylor's terms, "one is a self only among other selves" (p. 405). While there are important differences concerning how these themes are developed by different theorists, narrative conceptions focus on selves as self-interpretive, evaluative agents essentially connected to others.
Schechtman also addresses objections that come from critics like Strawson and Zahavi who argue that the minimal self -- the core self that is given in first-person experience -- has no narrative structure. The claim is that the minimal self exists episodically, not as part of an ongoing narrative, and accounts for a basic distinction between self and other. Schechtman suggests some interesting ways in which narrative theory may be developed to meet these objections and accommodate some of the insights from the phenomenological approach.
Part V begins with Derek Parfit's "The Unimportance of Identity." This article has been reprinted elsewhere and is the best twenty-page summary of this philosopher's highly influential view of persons and personal identity. Much of the philosophical discussion of personal identity over the last fifty years has centered on consideration of thought experiments that are designed to tell us "what matters" about our identity from a first-person point of view. Parfit employs a number of such thought experiments to show that identity -- whether we are numerically the same person over time -- is not what matters to us. Instead, according to Parfit, what matters is psychological continuity (some degree of qualitative similarity of our psychology), regardless of whether this continuity is uniquely realized in the same physical body or immaterial soul over time. Metaphysically speaking, Parfit rejects a belief in Cartesian Egos that may support the belief that identity is what matters and grounds his view in "constitutive reductionism", the view that a person is reducible to but not identical to bodily and psychological events.
In raising the issue of what matters to us, Parfit introduces the primary focus of the articles in Part V: If we are free, morally responsible agents, what must we assume or theorize about the self in order to understand agency, free will, and moral responsibility? On the other hand, if notions of agency, free will, and moral responsibility are illusory, is there any reason to believe in the reality of the self?
We commonly regard ourselves as self-conscious agents, as authors of our actions. We think that our conscious deliberation leads to conscious decisions to form intentions to act in certain ways and then to consciously perform those actions. Also, when engaged in actions, we experience our intentions as causing those actions and thus experience ourselves as agents of action. In "Self-Agency" Elisabeth Pacherie reviews the empirical evidence in support of this view. Her conclusion is that studies over the past twenty years show that consciousness plays a far less important role in the production of action than assumed in the folk-psychological conception of agency. In fact, a more radical interpretation of the empirical findings suggests that there is no such thing as conscious mental causation and that our experience of self-agency is therefore an illusion. Pacherie, herself, rejects the more radical interpretation, as she thinks that the experience of self-agency, itself, may play an important role in the integration of automatic and conscious processes in the production of action.
In "Self-Control in Action" Alfred Mele rejects the idea that a causal theory of the explanation of action that connects mental or brain states with actions can eliminate the self or agent. According to Mele, being a self-controlled agent or person means being able to bring your conduct in line with your decisive judgments, especially when your motivations may run counter to your better judgment. Mele regards the self or person as necessary in the explanation of at least some forms of human behavior. His view thus poses a serious challenge to reductive and eliminative theories of the self.
David Shoemaker takes up the issue of the relation between moral responsibility and the self. Shoemaker challenges the common assumption that moral responsibility presupposes personal identity, i.e., "in order for someone to be held morally responsible for A, that person must be the same person as the agent of A" (p. 488). He argues that psychological, biological, and narrative theories of personal identity are neither necessary nor sufficient to account for ownership of an action. In his view, moral responsibility presupposes ownership, but not personal identity. In this view, "one is morally responsible only for those actions that flow from one's deepest or truest self" (p. 501). Like Mele, Shoemaker links self-agency with bringing your actions in line with your values or what your care about.
It is worth noting that earlier articles in Part II, especially those by Bermundez and Tsakiris, examined ownership in the sense of what makes the experience of your body your own and how such bodily experience may count as a form of consciousness of your self. Shoemaker, of course, is concerned with ownership of actions that can illuminate an understanding of moral responsibility. In this context, Shoemaker believes that what makes some action my own has little to do with biology but is a psychological matter involving intentions and other psychological states. However, it would be interesting to examine further whether and how the earlier phenomenological analyses of bodily ownership, which focuses on the self as an embodied being, might be integrated into an understanding of the sense of ownership relevant to moral responsibility.
Part VI turns to pathologies of the self. Josef Parnas and Louis Sass focus on schizophrenia with an eye toward seeing what the pathology may tell us about the phenomenology of normal self-consciousness. Adopting a phenomenological approach, they propose that schizophrenia is a disorder of minimal selfhood, "a disturbance of the basic lived sense of subjectivity" (p. 542). It is an alteration in the self-presence, first-person perspective, and phenomenality that is normally present in experience. In their view, the existence of the self is constituted by how it is experienced. Since schizophrenics experience the world hyper-reflexively and with diminished self-affection, the self, itself, is disordered.
In "Multiple Selves" Jennifer Radden examines whether Dissociative Identity Disorder (formerly known as "Multiple Personality Disorder") involves multiple selves in a single human body. Drawing on her own work and that of Steven Braude and Carol Rovane, she identifies four main reasons for thinking that the disorder involves multiple selves. Radden points out how these features may be absent or present in varying degrees across the spectrum of clinical cases and observes that many of us may be a lot less unified that we think. She then considers the issue of whether the disorder warrants treatment with the aim of unifying the different selves. While she thinks that treatment is clearly appropriate in extreme cases involving serious distress and when the separate subselves suffer from serious dysfunction, treatment may not be warranted in other cases. In her view, whether the multiplicity enhances or detracts from suffering and functionality cannot be settled a priori, but is an empirical matter deserving clinical investigation. Moreover, dysfunction in the individual's mental health may result in dysfunction in relation to other persons and social institutions and practices. Because society values things like rational agency, trust, and stable relationships that require a certain degree of self-unity, the social norms argue in favor of unifying treatment for the disorder.
In "Autism and the Self" Peter Hobson examines how self-awareness is dependent on awareness of others, an issue that was the central focus of Rochat's article in Chapter 2. Hobson shows how the problems that autistic individuals have in relating to others affect their relations to themselves. In Hobson's view, to learn the meaning of "self" requires learning what it means to be another self. This theme of how the self develops out of its relations to others is explored further in the next chapter by Marcia Cavell and then by Hubert Hermans and Loraine Code in Chapters 28 and 31of Part VII. Following Richard Wollheim's idea of the self as one who leads a life, Cavell holds that the "self" is not a descriptive term but an evaluative one, having to do with integrity, i.e., unifying oneself to act in accord with a coherent set of values. Selves are thus not born, but grow through a creative process of social interaction.
Part VII begins with an excellent article by Richard Menary that contrasts "the Cartesian picture of the self as a thinking thing that is infallibly certain of its own nature, by the God-given light of reason" with "the pragmatist account of the self [Pierce, James, Dewey, and Mead] as fallible, embodied, and developed through social interaction" (p. 610, brackets added). Menary shows how the pragmatists are generally skeptical about any "giveness" in experience, especially if what is given in experience is thought to be sufficient for establishing a subjective, individualistic account of the self. Nonetheless, he links the pragmatist view with a primary, embodied and ecological sense of self found in the work of Gallagher and Neiser. Thus, there is some tension between the pragmatists' rejection of any infallibility or experiential certainty of the self, which presumably includes what may be given in embodiment and proprioception, and the acceptance of such primary bodily awareness of the self upon which the self is then constructed through further interaction with the environment and others.
In "The Social Construction of the Self" Kenneth Gergen provides further grounds for rejecting the idea that we have private, introspective, infallible knowledge of ourselves. Drawing on the work of Wittgenstein, Kuhn, Foucault, Mead, and Vygotsky, Gergen argues that all experience and knowledge of the self is mediated by language and relations with others, and so there is no self that can be known or that can exist independent of its relation to others. The self is thus fundamentally a relational being, constructed through conversational, narrative, and cultural practices.
This same emphasis on the social construction of the self appears in Hubert Hermans's article on the "dialogical self." Hermans holds that the self interacts with others in various ways, e.g., conversation, projects, competition, and cooperative ventures. In these relations, it "positions" itself differently by taking on various roles at different times and places. However, these different positions are in dialogue with each other and stand to each other in various relations of power, influenced by socially defined categories, such as class, gender, and race. The self is thus understood as a complex set of interrelated positions developed through social interaction.
In "Glass Selves" Elspeth Probyn focuses on how relations of power affect the self in the context of an examination of anorexia. Influenced by the psychoanalytic work of Althusser and Foucault, she examines how socially determined images, expectations, and gender assumptions about young girls leads to their "subjectification" and how anorexia may become a "mode of negotiating societal strictures" (p. 682). In raising these issues of how relations of power may influence the self, including how the researcher may influence the subject of research, Probyn poses a broader challenge to any type of "objective" research on the self.
The next article, Leonard Lawler's on the post-modern self, continues the focus on how the self is subject to relations of power. Drawing on the work of Lyotard, Lawler argues that the self does not just exist as a "we" because of its dialogical relations with others, as found in the work of Gergen, Hermans, and Probyn. Rather, the self is more like a political or economic entity, its identity and worth determined by its place in a system of totalitarian, capitalistic values.
In the concluding article in the anthology, Lorraine Code brings these considerations of power and social construction together in a feminist analysis of the self. Drawing on the work of Genevieve Lloyd, Carole Gilligan, Barbara Johnson, and Annette Baier, Code argues that the self is fundamentally a relational, situational, and embodied being, not the autonomous, abstract, and disembodied being assumed in traditional epistemology and ethics. For Code, "we" is the fundamental notion of the self.
Shaun Gallagher has assembled an outstanding array of articles to understand how contemporary research programs in diverse fields converge on the self to address the perennial problem of the nature of our being. The Oxford Handbook of the Self is an excellent, interdisciplinary resource for teaching and research.