Hegel never intended the Phenomenology of Spirit to be his signature work. Prior to rushing the book into publication at the very end of his six-year stint in Jena, he had been preparing a properly systematic philosophy in conjunction with lectures he was offering on logic, metaphysics, and the philosophy of nature. At this point in his intellectual development Hegel was still, in the eyes of many, Schelling's factotum. While the lecture notes do not merely rehash Schelling, they are in their own right equivocal. On the one hand, they have a retrospective cast. Hegel attempts to reformulate his earlier Frankfurt views in light of what he had taken on board from Schelling and from his further study of Kant. The Jena logic deploys a rejiggered set of Kantian categories, and the natural philosophy and metaphysics reveal his main inheritance from Schelling, the idea that 'force necessarily evolves form'. On the other hand, the notes have a prospective edge in that they contain in embryonic form various aspects of the Science of Logic and Encyclopedia. The Phenomenology is not altogether unconnected to these lecture outlines. Recall that it carried the full title, A System of Science: Phenomenology of Spirit, first part. The projected second part, presumably to be culled from the lecture materials, was never published. One might reason from this that phenomenology is systematic enough when placed in its appropriate position in a more all-inclusive philosophical structure. Indeed, the Encyclopedia, ostensibly a guide for students of the system as a whole, includes phenomenology as the second sub-part of the 'Philosophy of Spirit', the third main division of 'science'. But the point remains that what the reader has before her in the Phenomenology of Spirit does not by itself constitute science. It is, rather, a demanding introduction to it. Hegel underscores this when he writes in the Preface that phenomenology must answer to the individual's demand that she be provisioned a 'ladder' (Leiter), a unique, seamless, and necessary series of transitions that lead by means of immanent critique from 'common knowledge' to 'speculative thinking'.
Once Hegelianism was firmly established, it might stand to reason that Hegel would lose interest in keeping his ladder in place; it is, after all, for the uninitiated. The rehousing of the subject matter of phenomenology in the Encyclopedia reinforces this downplaying, for prior to embarking on phenomenology, one will have already advanced through logic and the philosophy of nature. Phenomenology has lost its introductory role; it is in the Encyclopedia strictly an object of speculative thinking, not a ladder at all. There may always be those who need the road to science demarcated of course, but once a set of philosophical views is entrenched there is less exigency in this regard. It is unsurprising, then, that only very late in life did Hegel make preparations to bring out a second edition of the work. His plan seems to have been to leave it unrevised, a document of its time. One exception: he intended to withdraw mention of 'science' in the title.
The Phenomenology was of its own mind, however, and over time it has become Hegel's best-known and most-studied work. This was not always the case. In the years in which Hegelianism was in force in Germany -- roughly 1831-48 -- the Phenomenology played a relatively minor role. Focus was, as Hegel intended it to be, on the technicalities of the system. Things began to change starting with Dilthey in Germany and continued to do so with the juggernaut that was the Wahl-Kojève-Hyppolite tradition of French Hegel interpretation. And so it remains today. The Phenomenology reigns as Hegel's classic, a text to place next to the Republic, the Meditations, the Critique of Pure Reason, and Being and Time.
Hegel's writings first became available in English with the publication of J. H. Stirling's The Secret of Hegel (1865), a partial translation of selections from both the Science of Logic and the Encyclopedia logic, together with textual commentary and an essay on the reception history of Hegel in Germany. Beginning in the 1870s, several works of Hegel's are translated into English, all by Scottish academics. English-language philosophy was not exactly up to speed with developments on the continent. Coleridge had some half-digested ideas about Schelling, and Carlyle's Sartor Resartus is as ignorant of German idealism as it is humorous, which is to say: very. When interest in Hegel did develop in Britain, it replayed the initial German situation and stressed logic, not phenomenology. The Phenomenology was the last major work of Hegel's to appear in English translation, in 1910. That translation, by J. B. Baillie, is still in print. It is not unusable, but it is rather free and somewhat theological. In 1977 A. V. Miller brought out a new translation that gave Hegel's prose a cleaner line and featured J. N. Findlay's substantive foreward and paragraph-by-paragraph analysis of the text. This quickly unseated Baillie as the standard English version.
We now have two new translations by noted Hegel scholars Michael Inwood and Terry Pinkard, both accomplished. They improve on, but are not vastly superior to, Miller. Translation of this unyielding text presents special challenges. Pinkard provides an admirably clear statement of his position on translating it, and his stated aim of rendering the text as clearly as possible without letting his interpretation of Hegel's philosophical positions form the terms of translation is well realized. (Of course, as Pinkard notes, no one can be expected to hold back entirely in this regard.) He also provides a trusty overview of the Phenomenology's main themes and a lively account of the history of its production. Inwood also renders the text with an eye cocked to neutrality, at times a bit less literally than Pinkard, no doubt with readability in mind. In place of a synoptic overview, Inwood offers a 170-page, paragraph-by-paragraph commentary on the text. This follows Miller's practice, but Inwood's guide is both more textually engaged and more philosophically sophisticated than its predecessor. The commentary on the Preface and Introduction is especially worthwhile. Both translations append useful glossaries of technical vocabulary; Inwood's is discursive, Pinkard's definitional. Both retain Miller's practice of numbering paragraphs for ease of reference. Pinkard also includes marginal pagination to the standard scholarly edition of Hegel's work. Both volumes are expensive, well out of the reach of students in hardbound. It is good news, then, that paperback editions of both are planned.
Both translations are very dependable, but of course there are differences in approach. Consider a representative sample. I have chosen a passage early in Hegel's account of the struggle between 'enlightenment' and 'superstition' on account of its relative lack of controversy and inclusion of specifically Hegelian concepts for which acute translation especially matters. Here is the original:
Die verschiedenen Weisen des negativen Verhaltens des Bewußtseins, teils des Skeptizismus, teils des theoretischen und praktischen Idealismus, sind untergeordnete Gestalten gegen diese der reinen Einsicht und ihrer Verbreitung, der Aufkärung; denn sie ist aus der Substanz geboren, weiß das reine Selbst des Bewußtseins als absolut und nimmt es mit dem reinen Bewußtsein des absoluten Wesens aller Wirklichkeit auf.
The various modes of the negative attitude of consciousness, the attitude of skepticism and that of theoretical and practical idealism, are inferior shapes compared with that of pure insight and its diffusion, of the Enlightenment; for pure insight is born of the substance [of Spirit], knows the pure self of consciousness to be absolute, and enters into dispute with the pure consciousness of the absolute essence of all reality (329).
The various modes of the negative attitude of consciousness, the attitude of skepticism and that of theoretical and practical idealism, are subordinate shapes compared with that of pure insight and its diffusion, the enlightenment; for pure insight is born of the substance, knows the pure Self of consciousness as absolute, and copes with the pure consciousness of the absolute essence of all actuality (216).
The various modes of the negative conduct of consciousness, which are in part those of skepticism and in part those of theoretical and practical idealism, are subordinate shapes with respect to those of pure insight and of its diffusion, the Enlightenment. This is so because pure insight is born from the substance, and it both knows the pure self of consciousness as absolute, and it incorporates that self into the pure consciousness of the absolute essence of all actuality (314).
The first thing to note is that Miller's translation is not unworkable. But teaching the passage would require supplying precision to some of the terms in light of Hegel's conception of phenomenological dialectic. Both Inwood and Pinkard catch much of this in advance. Here are four points of interest:
(A) Take 'Verhalten'. Miller and Inwood give 'attitude'. This is not incorrect, but it is slightly less sensitive to something that Pinkard picks up with 'conduct', i.e. that consciousness is for Hegel a doing and not merely a knowing. More precisely, for Hegel theories are not freestanding bodies of propositions that are true or false no matter what. A theory has internal to it that it be taken up and acted upon in a certain way, i.e. for Hegel there is no bright line that can be drawn ultimately between the semantics and pragmatics of a theory (or form of consciousness).
(B) It may seem trivial, but there is something to be said on the issue of capitalization. Inwood avows strict decapitalization, except where disambiguation demands otherwise (xxi), an excellent protocol and a significant departure from Miller. Pinkard is a bit freer on this score. Accordingly, Inwood, provides 'Self' an initial capital in order to signal that the term refers to a specifically philosophical conception. 'Enlightenment' is not capitalized because that might lead one to conclude that Hegel is referring to the Enlightenment. (Inwood does retain the definite article. One simply might have given: 'enlightenment'.) Pinkard retains the initial capital (and the definite article). Recall that 'enlightenment' names a form of consciousness, i.e. an idealized conceptual array, not a historical period in modern European history. There is a temptation when reading the Phenomenology to index forms of consciousness to actual historical structures. This is especially true of the 'Spirit' and 'Religion' sections of the book, which are more overtly historical in presentation. One might even reason that it is permissible to read back into the less historically explicit earlier sections of the book implicit historical referents, e.g. that Sensory Certainty is Aurignacian, etc. The guiding idea would be that Hegel had only hit upon a fully worked-out conception of the historical embeddedness of forms of consciousness in writing 'Spirit' and 'Religion'. One might look to the publication history of the book for support. Hegel initially considered the book complete with 'Reason', had a change of heart, and doubled its size. If it were the case that the reconsideration that leads to the inclusion of 'Spirit' and 'Religion' is also a rethinking of the very concept of Geist, one that mandates closer approximation of forms of consciousness to specific historical instantiations, then one might turn back to the less obviously historical chapters and try to read them in this fashion as well. In essence, the additional material would reach back and recast its own 'textual past'. But both the Preface and Introduction make clear that phenomenology deals with conceptual development in time abstracted from actual historical development. That is, phenomenology is concerned with serial diachronic development of forms of consciousness, but does not foreordain any particular run of history. It might have been the case that stoicism was not a Hellenistic/Roman school of thought; it is not possible, however, that the conceptual formation 'stoicism' does not obtain in the run of Geist's self-development at the very stage in that run Hegel assigns to it.
(C) For 'untergeordnete Gestalten' both Inwood and Pinkard prefer 'subordinate shapes' to Miller's 'inferior shapes'. 'Shapes' refers to forms of consciousness. 'Subordinate' captures better than 'inferior' the relatedness of a superseding form of consciousness to what it supersedes through sublation (Aufhebung). What is inferior may well be left behind as nugatory; what is subordinated is less likely to be regarded so.
(D) Both Pinkard and Inwood translate 'Wirklichkeit' as 'actuality' and not, as Miller does, 'reality'. This is a significant improvement. Again, 'reality' is not wrong, but it is shallow. As both Inwood (323) and Pinkard (xli-ii) note, the verb/adjective forms from which 'Wirklichkeit' derives (i.e. 'wirken'/'wirklich'), denote presence with effect. Marking this is particularly salient when translating Hegel, since a concept is actual for him only if operating at its leading edge, i.e. so that it might advance itself towards completeness. Many real things are not 'actual' in the intended sense; they exist but not in ways that engage their internal developmental resources.
Stirling thought that to read Hegel was to enter a latter-day Telesterion, where Truth is unveiled to a rapt elect. Mill opined that a sustained dose of Hegelian prose might addle the brain irreversibly -- rapturous perhaps, but not precisely what Stirling had in mind. More evenhanded was Marx, who in a letter to his father admitted initial distress at Hegel's 'grotesque, craggy melody' (groteske Felsenmelodie). Hegel's philosophical voice may seduce; it may disturb; it may whistle forlornly amidst the cliffs. Perhaps it does all three simultaneously. In any case, Inwood and Pinkard, each in their own way, make for the most tuneful English-language Hegel yet.