2018.11.16

Arthur Schopenhauer

The World as Will and Representation, Volume 2

Arthur Schopenhauer, The World as Will and Representation, Volume 2, Judith Norman, Alistair Welchman, and Christopher Janaway (eds., trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2018, xlvii + 711pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521870344.

Reviewed by Dale E. Snow, Loyola University of Maryland


This is the third volume of the projected six volume English-language edition of the collected works of Arthur Schopenhauer. The first volume was The Two Fundamental Problems of Ethics (2009), and the second was the first volume of The World as Will and Representation (2011), which was originally published in 1819. In 1844 Schopenhauer published a revised version of it, and added an entire second volume in the form of a commentary on the first, thus completing the magnum opus. It is this second volume, translated and edited by Judith Norman, Alastair Welchman, and series editor Christopher Janaway, which is here under review.

Perhaps as a result of the discipline of translating Schopenhauer, the introduction is more lucid and useful than is often the case, identifying some of the major controversies and stumbling blocks with admirable precision. The translators again raise the question of the "single thought" (xiii) Schopenhauer claimed lay behind all of his philosophizing, and suggest that there is a clue in the four book division of both the first and second volumes, which prompts the reader to consider the will, then representation, then return to the will and again to representation. This process itself leads to a fuller grasp of the meaning of the often repeated insight that there is one world which ineluctably must appear to us as either will or representation.

The introduction presents helpful discussions of the principle of sufficient reason, of Schopenhauer's idea of the self, and his understanding of metaphysics. Schopenhauer had attended Fichte's and Schleiermacher's lectures in 1811-13, and he saw himself as a happy escapee from the general predilection for meaningless abstraction that characterized most post-Kantian philosophers. However, this did not mean the abandonment of metaphysics; on the contrary, the introduction correctly emphasizes that Schopenhauer sees man as the "metaphysical animal" (xviii, 169) who by nature seeks a satisfactory explanation of the reality in which he finds himself. This leads into a discussion of the doctrine of the primacy of the will that is admirably clear and straightforward. It is made vivid by the citation of passages in which Schopenhauer seems to anticipate such psychological phenomena as confirmation bias and the psychoanalytic concept of repression (xxi). Finally, the introduction considers Schopenhauer's reflections on aesthetic experience and artistic genius, his famous (or infamous) metaphysics of sexual love and his treatment of suffering and the value and meaning of life.

As was true of the first volume, the scholarly apparatus is impressive in its scope and thoroughness: the endnotes identifying passages that were edited, deleted, or altered by Schopenhauer in the various editions of the works will be of particular interest to scholars. There is also a chronology of Schopenhauer's life, a bibliography of German editions, English translations, and selected secondary literature on Schopenhauer in English, as well as a glossary of the proper names that appear in the text.

The quality of the translation, as in the first volume, is not just an improvement on E. F. J. Payne's translation with respect to preserving philosophically significant distinctions more faithfully. It also makes a commendable effort to capture something of the peevishness and self-righteous tone of Schopenhauer's criticisms of his contemporaries; for example, "the mind-rotting ravages of Hegelry," (44), or the "unspeakable and torturous boredom" (90) of reading Schelling. Appended to the introduction is a note on Schopenhauer's use of other languages on virtually every page of the book, which could range from a single word to extended passages, and the decision to translate nearly all such passages into English and preserve the original in a footnote. Although this choice breaks with previous translators' practice of leaving such quotations in the original and providing an English equivalent in a footnote, it contributes immensely to the readability of the text. This practice has been bemoaned for in effect concealing the erudition and cosmopolitanism of Schopenhauer's original text. It is quite literally true that it violates the letter of that text, yet surely it contributes much to preserving the overall clarity and flow of the argument for those readers less linguistically adept than Schopenhauer, which would be almost all of us.

The translators note that this volume is no mere supplement to the first, but contains Schopenhauer's most mature reflections on many topics, including the metaphysics of the will and the meaning of salvation. In this respect too, the translation surpasses Payne's in more closely capturing the elegiac quality of his almost oracular pronouncements toward the end of the volume. Even if Schopenhauer did not call his philosophy pessimistic, as the translators observe, he certainly thought that one of his accomplishments was revealing the true nature of suffering as well as how to overcome it. Like Kant, Schopenhauer knew that the pursuit of happiness was both a fool's errand and destined to fail, but his explanation went well beyond Kant's:

Everything in life proclaims that the pursuit of earthly happiness is doomed to be in vain and that happiness itself will eventually be recognized as an illusion. The basis for this lies deep in the essence of things. Accordingly, life for most human beings turns out to be miserable and short. . . . Life presents itself as an ongoing deception, in matters both small and large. What is promised is not delivered, unless it is to show how undesirable the thing desired was: and so we are deceived now by the hope and now by what we had hoped for. What is given is given only that it can be taken away. (588)

Schopenhauer also claimed credit for another closely related accomplishment, that of showing the hollowness and insufficiency of optimistic philosophical theories, a group in which he included all of his predecessors, from the "pantheists" to Spinoza, a thinker not often associated with optimism.

I alone acknowledge the full magnitude of the world's evils, because my answer to the question of their origin coincides with that of the origin of the world. By contrast, because all other systems are optimistic, the question of the origin of evils is an incurable and constantly recurring disease that afflicts them; they struggle through with palliatives and quack remedies but always relapse. (660)

Therefore salvation is only truly to be found in relinquishing both our optimism and our hopes for happiness in any form, or overcoming "that one innate error . . . that we exist to be happy" (650). Once a person has somehow realized that it is an error, however deep-seated, he will at last understand the world and find that it makes sense, even if it is of a highly unsatisfactory nature:

Accidents of every shape and size will no longer will no longer surprise him, even if they injure him, since he has seen that it is precisely pain and suffering that work toward the true goal of life, the turning of the will away from it. Whatever might happen, this will give him a wonderful composure, similar to the composure of the invalid who tolerates the pain of prolonged and excruciating treatment as proof of its efficacy. -- Suffering speaks clearly enough from the whole of human existence as its true destination. (651)

Payne renders the last word of this passage as 'destiny,' which does not harmonize as well with Schopenhauer's many metaphors of traveling and journeying through life, and misleadingly implies that the end of life has somehow been imposed by another entity or force. The passage concludes: "There is an unmistakable touch of intentionality in all of this." (652) 'Intentionality' is the translators' choice for Absichtlichkeit, which Payne translates as 'deliberation'. Although 'intentionality' may seem to evoke the question of whose intention is referenced, it is a better fit with Schopenhauer's other musings on design in nature and teleological forms of explanation than the altogether puzzling 'deliberation.'

Although John Atwell has argued convincingly for the autobiographical origins of what Schopenhauer presents as the universal human need for metaphysics, the translators do a masterful job of presenting this yearning in universal terms.[1]

People feel an inescapable need for metaphysics as such; and we see that religions are therefore very good at taking the place of this metaphysics for the great mass of people, who cannot be obliged to think; this is in part with a view to practice, as a beacon for their actions, as the public standard for rectitude and virtue (as Kant expressed it so well); in part as an indispensable comfort in the difficult sufferings of life, where it completely replaces an objectively true metaphysics by lifting human beings above themselves and their temporal existence as well as any metaphysics ever could; this is an excellent display of the great value of religion, indeed of its indispensability. (176)

In contrast, Payne's translation hews closer to the German word order, at the cost of being stilted, and also breaks up the long sentence rather arbitrarily:

We therefore see that in the main, and for the great majority unable to devote themselves to thinking, religions fill very well the place of metaphysics in general, the need of which man feels to be imperative. They do this partly for a practical purpose as the guiding star of their action, as the public standard of integrity and virtue as Kant expresses it; partly as the indispensable consolation in the deep sorrows of life. In this they completely take the place of an objectively true system of metaphysics, since they lift man above himself and above existence in time, as well, perhaps, as such a system ever could. (Payne, v. II, 167)

This is a long book and completing the two volumes must have been a herculean labor, so it seems almost churlish to observe that the proofreading leaves something to be desired: 'than' where 'that' is clearly meant, (xvi); 'ulitmate' for 'ultimate,' (xx); 'agument' for 'argument,' (xxiii); a reference to a 'course' sieve, (34); 'refection' for 'reflection,' (281); 'accidently' for 'accidentally,' (323, 661).

Some of Schopenhauer's most ardent readers have not been professional philosophers. From Julius Frauenst├Ądt, the first disciple, to E. F. J. Payne to the late Steven G. Neeley, gifted amateurs have been drawn to The World as Will and Representation by the power and passion of its arguments and its promise to unveil the truth of life to those strong enough to bear it. This Cambridge edition translation, which deserves to become the new standard, will serve both scholars and other students equally well.


[1] "Schopenhauer on Suffering, Death, Guilt and the Consolation of Metaphysics," in Schopenhauer: Essays in Honor of his 200th Birthday, ed. Eric van der Luft, Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1988, 51-66.