2019.08.03

Jacques Derrida

Theory and Practice

Jacques Derrida, Theory and Practice, David Wills (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2019, 127pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226572345.

Reviewed by Edward Baring, Drew University


Jacques Derrida's Theory and Practice, a seminar he taught at the École Normale Supérieure (ENS) over the academic year 1976-1977, has all the signs of being a highly provocative text. As the publisher's blurb notes, here Derrida engages with the Marxist tradition, long before any purported "political turn" or his ground-breaking Specters of Marx (1993). The promise of provocation is only heightened by the fact that Derrida frames his engagement with a reading of the antihumanist Marxist Louis Althusser, who was his colleague at the ENS and thus the teacher and mentor of many of the students he was addressing in the course.

Derrida had grappled with Althusser's ideas before. In Of Grammatology (1967), which also grew out of an ENS seminar, Derrida made many veiled references to his colleague, not least in the formal parallel between Derrida's account of grammatology and Althusser's account of Marx's work. Derrida argued that the linguist Fernand de Saussure had opened the path to grammatology in his presentation of semiology, such that his arguments could be rewritten with the former standing in for the latter:

I shall call it (grammatology) . . . Since the science does not yet exist, no one can say what it would be; but it has a right to existence, a place staked out in advance. Linguistics is only a part of that general science . . . ; the laws discovered by (grammatology) will be applicable to linguistics.[1]

In identifying a new object of study in the lacunae of the classical tradition, Derrida was mimicking Althusser's presentation of Marx's breakthrough as a re-writing of Adam Smith:

The value of labor (power) is equal to the value of the subsistence goods necessary for the maintenance and reproduction of labor (power).[2]

Adopting the form of Althusser's argument, Derrida sought to challenge it. Althusser had argued that Marx's discovery of labor power inaugurated historical materialism as a "science." But for Derrida, grammatology unsettled the very concept of science.[3] In questioning Althusser's scientific pretensions, Derrida was also expressing caution about the political interventions they authorized. Nevertheless, in Derrida's early writings Althusser is not mentioned, and the references are subtle and easily missed.

This is why the 1976 seminar stands out: here Derrida names Althusser directly. The focus of the lectures is the opposition between theory and practice within the Marxist tradition. Derrida homes in on Marx's famous 11th Thesis on Feuerbach, traditionally translated into English as "Philosophers have hitherto only interpreted the world in various ways; the point is to change it." According to this version, Marx gave transformative practice priority. Derrida argues, however, that a closer examination of the 11th thesis allows two conflicting readings. Though the thesis might suggest that practice marks the point where we leave philosophy behind, it could also imply that practice was the completion of philosophy and thus remained part of it (14). Althusser had adopted the second line of argument, asserting that practice must be led by a rigorous theory (37). It was from this perspective that he criticized humanist Marxism; he did not fault it for its attention to and valorization of the human, but for its insufficient theoretical rigor. For Derrida, because Althusser consistently privileged "theory," subordinating all other regions of knowledge to it, his thought resembled traditional metaphysics (47). Moreover, and despite Althusser's disavowals, his metaphysics was a humanist one, because he took practice to be distinctively human (59-60).

Derrida raises the stakes of his criticism by comparing Althusser to the Italian Marxist Antonio Gramsci: As Derrida points out, Gramsci also considered Marxist praxis to be a continuation and development of Marxist philosophy, not its end (44). By asserting this proximity Derrida thrust his analyses into the center of a debate over the future of the French Communist Party (PCF). The PCF had aligned itself with Gramsci's heirs in the Italian Communist Party by embracing a form of "Eurocommunism," and in early 1976 had excised the doctrine of the "dictatorship of the proletariat" from its program. Althusser had opposed this move, and in his most developed discussion, a 1978 essay on "The Crisis of Marxism," he formulated his misgivings through a criticism of Gramsci's theory of hegemony.[4]

Derrida's readings are always enlightening. And in David Wills's excellent translation, we are confronted with rigorous and probing investigations of the theory/practice opposition, which weave together Marx and Althusser with Kant, Heidegger, and Aristotle in surprising ways. So too, the final reading of Heidegger's essay, "The Question concerning Technology," is extremely rich and thought-provoking. Scholars interested in these figures and texts will learn much from the edition.

But for a seminar that engages so directly with the Marxist tradition, and flags its relevance for one of the most hotly debated questions on the left at the time, Derrida's conclusions might come across as rather disappointingly apolitical. First, when Derrida identifies Althusser's metaphysical investments, he is aiming primarily at a previous iteration of the older man's thought. Indeed in challenging Althusser's "theoreticism," Derrida picks up a line of argument that Althusser had developed himself, most prominently in the "Reply to John Lewis" (1973). Althusser had come to believe that he had separated theory and practice too sharply in his work before 1967: theory was not an autonomous realm but was embroiled in and thus beholden to political and social developments. As he argued "philosophy is, in the last instance, class struggle in theory."[5] That is, in broad strokes, Derrida is not so much offering a provocative challenge to his fellow teacher's work, as reiterating Althusser's assessment of his own trajectory (69). This, second, muddied the waters about Derrida's intervention into the Eurocommunism debate. By aligning Gramsci most clearly with an earlier version of Althusser's thought (e.g., 39 and 70), Derrida merely brushes up against without addressing the problem of the "dictatorship of the proletariat" (see 57). For all the ways Derrida complicates the theory/practice opposition, it is hard to avoid the impression that this is a decidedly theoretical text.

We can think through this disappointment by reading the book within the context of Derrida's most direct and explicit political engagement at the time: The Groupe de Recherches sur l'Enseignement Philosophique (GREPH). Formed in early 1975 in anticipation of the Haby reforms, which would make philosophy merely optional for the final year of high school, GREPH promoted a wide-ranging analysis and transformation of the teaching of philosophy in France.[6] Derrida's first major published contribution to the project, the essay "Where a Teaching Body Begins and How it Ends," appeared the very year of his Theory and Practice seminar, in a volume titled Politiques de la Philosophie. Here too Derrida picked up the theory and practice opposition, arguing that GREPH's project depended upon an internal deconstruction of logocentrism; for, as he had long argued, purportedly "external" critiques tended to reproduce the metaphysical dogmatism they sought to escape. It was important that GREPH was located, at least partially, within the philosophical institutions it sought to contest.

Derrida was nonetheless adamant that it could not remain within them. As he argued in an historical and philosophical analysis of his own institutional position, a Maître-Assistant charged with preparing students for state exams (the agrégation), in his classes he was only required to "repeat" a content, and thus "should produce nothing, at least if to produce means to innovate to transform, to bring about the new."[7] Transgressing these limitations would have severe consequences for his students: if Derrida did not prepare them adequately for the exam, they might fail, with all the attendant personal and professional consequences. That is why Derrida distinguished his teaching, which was beholden to the pedagogical structure of repetition, from his publications, which did not.

One might question the starkness of Derrida's opposition. After all, he had long insisted on the transformative power of repetition, and many of his publications did emerge out of his ENS seminars, not least "Where a Teaching Body Begins." Derrida was insistent that those who read him could "construct the network" that held his teaching work and publications together.[8] In the 1976 essay, Derrida related the two using the language of "abstention." Though his work always challenged the unity of philosophy, and thus disrupted the academic establishment (the "universitas") which was founded upon it, in the teaching situation these lines of argument could only be sneaked in as "contraband." Derrida "abstained" (at least "partially") from implicating the work he pursued elsewhere. One could use the language of "abstention" to read the two versions of deconstruction Derrida sketched at the beginning of his essay. If deconstruction abstained from moving beyond "conceptual content," it would be a "simple semantic or conceptual deconstitution," and thus just another "modality" of the "internal self-critique of philosophy." A truly effective deconstruction, in contrast, would also "challenge the philosophical scene, all its institutional norms and forms, as well as everything that makes them possible."[9]

Theory and Practice, a seminar which does not seem to have been the basis of a publication during Derrida's lifetime, hews more closely to the former option. The "contraband" is there: Derrida draws attention to the "overflowing" of philosophy, the way it surpasses itself and thus breaks the supposed unity of the philosophical project. This guides his criticism of both Althusser and Heidegger. Both seek to leave philosophy behind in favor of "Theory" and "thinking" respectively. But in both cases they reproduce the unitary structure that their arguments should undermine. And yet, the majority of the seminar is restricted to a "semantic-philosophical genealogy" of the theory/practice pair (4), and the text is dotted with moments where Derrida abstains from moving beyond this. On the very first page, Derrida makes reference to the situation of the agrégation and its curriculum, and he invites his students "not to be satisfied with critiquing it, in theory, but to try to transform this situation effectively practically." And yet he cuts off this line of argument immediately: "No further in that direction" (1). Later he argues that the discussion of theory and practice could well lead one to a discussion of psychoanalysis and speech act theory, amongst others, and yet he declines to take his argument in this direction (only briefly returning to them in the 9th session), because he intends to focus on a "rigorously philosophical" genealogy (5-6). In the seventh session, Derrida presents his seminar up until that point as merely "a discourse or text on theory/practice," and he declared that he had felt compelled to transform his teaching practice, desisting "henceforth from referring to a previously written text" (97). On only the next page, however, he noted that "my new practice of improvising on the basis of notes was not only a fiction but a mechanism that encouraged repetition," and thus he decided to "return at least provisionally to my old practice, at least at certain moments" (98-99). Because this innovation and its abrupt cessation were written into the seminar text -- that is, scripted in advance -- it is clear that Derrida was most interested in his experiment's failure. The agrégation seminar was a place where novelty had to be contained, not unleashed.

Rather than being a precursor to his later engagement with Marx, one with profound implications our understanding of Marxism and modern society, Derrida's Theory and Practice is best seen as probing the limitations of the agrégation seminar, ones he had only recently drawn attention to, and which were set in greater relief by his chosen topic. And there perhaps is the greatest practical intervention of this ostensibly theoretical text: by showing how the demands of the agrégation reduced even Marxism to an academic exercise, Derrida came to demonstrate most powerfully the need for institutional change.


[1] Jacques Derrida, Of Grammatology, trans. G. Spivak (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1976), 51.

[2] Louis Althusser, Reading Capital, trans. Ben Brewster (New York: Pantheon, 1970), 22. Presentation amended. Althusser merely notes the absence of the word "power" by empty parentheses.

[3] Derrida, Of Grammatology, 74.

[4] In Louis Althusser, Écrits philosophiques et politiques, vol 1. (Paris: IMEC, 1994), 500-511.

[5] Louis Althusser, Essays in Self-Criticism, trans. Grahame Lock (London: NLB, 1976), 37.

[6] See on this Samir Haddad, "Derrida and Education," in Leonard Lawlor and Zeynep Direk eds. A Companion to Derrida (Chichester: Wiley and Sons 2014).

[7] Jacques Derrida, Who's Afraid of Philosophy?: Right to Philosophy I, trans. Jan Plug (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2002), 75.

[8] Derrida, Who's Afraid of Philosophy?, 77. I have tried to reconstruct this network in Edward Baring, The Young Derrida and French Philosophy, 1965-1968 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011), chapter 7.

[9] Derrida, Who's Afraid of Philosophy?, 72-7. See also Benoît Peeters, Jacques Derrida (Paris: Flammarion, 2010), 339, where Derrida poses this difference as one between theory and practice.