2018.05.24

Michael Hampe

What Philosophy Is For

Michael Hampe, What Philosophy Is For, Michael Winkler (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2018, 332pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226365282.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Michael Hampe has had a significant career as Professor of Philosophy in the Department of Humanities and Social and Political Sciences at the Swiss Federal Institute of Technology (ETH Zürich). As befits this institutional setting, he has worked primarily in the philosophy of biology and the theory of laws of nature while also maintaining interests in science and society, critical theory, and literature, as well as in a number of thinkers who have joined these topics together, such as Whitehead, Dewey, and Deleuze. This volume is the English translation of Hampe's 2014 Die Lehren der Philosophie: Eine Kritik -- the doctrines or teachings of philosophy: a criticism. Under these titles, Hampe offers "above all a metaphilosophical text" that is "a critique of the current academic condition of philosophy" (xii). Philosophy as a body of putative doctrines is both empty -- real doctrines and explanations are the province exclusively of the sciences -- and a prop to unjust social authority. What is left is nondoctrinal philosophy as the activity of criticizing "circumstances that exist in the world" (xi) or as "a poetic critique of factually existing circumstances" from within them (257). Hampe's enemies are those whom he takes to be systematizers and theorizers, including Plato (or at least Platonism), Kant, Hegel, Habermas, Brandom, and analytic philosophy in general. His heroes are Socrates, Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, Adorno, Whitehead, Dewey, Rorty, Cavell, and Geuss (to whom the book is dedicated).

While both doctrinal and nondoctrinal philosophy seek to "influence . . . how human beings react to the world . . . and what kind of life people lead" (6), doctrinal philosophy founders in the face of both non-reason-governed historical change of forms of life and the fact that it is "unable in its own right to celebrate explanatory successes without turning into empirical science" (9). It offers "no generally valid philosophical doctrines" (26), and "philosophical doctrines barely find an audience outside academia" (16). Better, then, for philosophers to function à la Rorty as "dissident speakers" (4) who might from within their circumstances invent new vocabularies that prompt "conceptual re-education" (5) and hence new ways of seeing and responding to things. Or better à la Deleuze to carry out "experiments with concepts" (35) with the aim of seeing things otherwise.

Following Adorno on the primacy of the object, Hampe claims that "a concrete experience of particulars" that foregoes assertion and even conceptualization is "a condition for happiness" (13-14). "Arriving at the end of asserting" (232), we should, along lines sketched in Hofmannsthal's 1902 "Lord Chandos Letter," carry out "a radical criticism of the artificial generalities of the sign system" (234). "Abstractly judging speech becomes an act of violence against the histories of individuals" (246). We might instead do well to pursue "the kind of happiness that occurs to the person who sees things for the first time, who does not have to consider them as cases for the use of repeatable concepts" (249). (Is this a doctrine? Is it consistent with the Deleuzean non-doctrinal use of concepts that is also urged? Is it clear that attentions to particulars are not often enough enriched by suitable conceptualizations?) Silence and a kind of anarcho-socialist democracy are better than assertion, explanation, and attempts to engineer social orders. A great deal turns here on the force of "abstractly" in "abstractly judging speech." If it is synonymous with "inattentively," then of course inattentive judgment is bad; if, on the other hand, room is left for non-abstract, concrete judgment, then not all judgment is bad as such. Yet Hampe holds that "moving inside . . . human language . . . means . . . reference to what is actually there at this moment can get lost" (250).

As also in Wittgenstein, Dewey, Adorno, and Deleuze, Hampe's opposition to what he takes to be doctrinal philosophical business as usual within academia is reciprocally both ground and consequence of opposition to commodity society, taken as reflecting "a result-driven understanding of life and also of philosophy" (45). Against commodity society's leveling impulses and its orientation to "achieving, sustaining, and renewing consensus" (103), we might better "abhor a complete homogenization in the use of language" and maintain "the contradictoriness of speaking in real language communities" (102). We should reject "the fiction of a caste of cultural concept gourmets" (84) and the political-administrative functionaries whose work they support, and we should remember that people do many different worthwhile things that have (putatively) little to do with concepts, including "the feeding of babies or the stroking of cats" (111). People can happily live with contradictions, as long as they do not stop to theorize about them (138). In general, a radical democracy along the lines of Dewey's "Great Community" or Hans Joas's "sacralized democracy" (167), in which (one might say) a hundred flowers bloom and a thousand schools of thought contend, is to be preferred to both commodity society and the modern liberal bureaucratic state. We should go for what Hampe calls open-ended "Einzelwesenverwirklichung (individual actualization)" (157) rather than standing order, individual or social. Generally, this will require "exiting from the assertive and calculating life" (260).

In the pursuit of individual actualization, stories are more important than theories. Stories are the appropriate "organon of individuals' self-reflection" (198). They track what Hampe calls "biography generators" -- crucial moments of experience that motivate swerves in the courses of life of individuals and that can thus function for readers as "paradigms of transition" (196). Appropriate, non-doctrinal self-reflection requires being "able to read the paradigmatic stories inherent in human lives with appreciation" (197). (Are these general claims about the importance of stories?) One might see much of Hampe's text as telling the story of his own increasing disenchantments with and swerves away from doctrinal philosophy.

Within a highly pluralized society -- whether that of commodity society with its (false) individualism or a more ideal Great Community -- one cannot, however, expect or demand that any single story with a clear endpoint (ideal or tragic) either could or should serve as a general paradigm for all readers. Hampe adduces J. M. Coetzee's novels that present Elisabeth Costello lecturing and writing to others who reject her views and Fernando Pessoa's multiple persona poems as model literary provocations in depicting the openness and contestation of the generation and reception of stories. Either a Socratic individualist community in which we do "something like making music with words" (252) and wherein we "infinitely tell stories" or "a community . . . of those who predominantly are silent, primarily are listening, [and] who barely make judgments any longer" (251) is to be preferred to a life of getting and spending and of inevitably foundering instrumental control.

Overall, this book gives a high-altitude view of academic philosophy and its plights, with a high ratio of pronouncement to close analysis of either problems or texts. Depending on one's attitudes toward contemporary academic life and general culture, one might regard this as either magisterial or too quick by half. One wonders what Hampe might make of philosophical work on somewhat more local problems such as, for example, internalism vs. externalism in the philosophy of mind, cognitivist-propositionalist vs. neo-Jamesean bodily reaction theories of emotion, problems of economic justice, or the semantics of counterfactuals, even if various addresses to these problems also presuppose and express various metaphilosophical and metaphysical commitments that remain contested. In general, it might be better not to undertake metaphilosophy as if it were a separable field of study, but instead to do metaphilosophy and substantive philosophy together, in awareness of how they inform each other, as one tries, haltingly, to make sense of things. In an early essay, Cavell, one of Hampe's heroes, tells us that if he denies any distinction, "it is the still fashionable distinction between philosophy and meta-philosophy."[1] The works of Wittgenstein, Adorno, and Dewey are similarly simultaneously metaphilosophical and substantively philosophical.

In developing the Adornian theme of non-subsumptive attention to the concrete particular, Hampe verges on a form of either radical nominalism (there are only sheer particulars, with nothing essential in common) or Heracliteanism (there are only processes in eternal flux), as if reality nowhere carved itself at its joints. As a result, his account of concept adoption and use verges on an unhappy decisionism. Perhaps we should reject strong forms of metaphysical realism (doctrines of forms, hylomorphic composites, medieval universals, natural kinds, and so forth) supposedly vouchsafed by expert metaphysical insight. But one might nonetheless proceed pragmatically, in a realistic spirit, attending to what Austin once called "moderate-sized specimens of dry goods"[2] as real enough, and one might modestly accept the thought that nature forces some concepts on us (insofar as we develop concepts at all), such as "edge," "motion," and "edible," without any overbearing metaphysics.

In general, the dichotomy that Hampe offers us -- doctrine and assertion vs. either silence or open-ended storytelling about experiences of particulars -- seems non-exhaustive. Patient critical description of objects of experience, including works of art, other persons, sporting events, and pets, among other things, seems to fall well in between these two alternatives. Intimacy with particulars can be built in part on such forms of verbalized attention, not only on silences and stories. (What is it to know Shakespeare or one's spouse or the defensive formations of the Arsenal Gunners?)

Perhaps most importantly, Hampe's recommendation of either a Deweyan Great Community or a form of anarcho-democratic silence -- recommendations that are inconsistent with each other, since a Deweyan community involves a good deal of cooperative talk -- fails to sit well with his nominalism and anti-doctrinalism. More important yet, in a globalized, neoliberal world, a recommendation to cast off political authorities and authoritative institutional arrangements (however unjust they frequently are in their ordinary operations) threatens to end up endorsing plutocracy and corporate dominance. Without laws, courts, securities and exchange commissions, and all the rest, economic exploitation and environmental degradation are likely to be substantially worse than they already are. In failing to take due account of this, Hampe's perspective is perhaps shaped by his Swiss institutional setting, where there is still a kind of social consensus about fairness, where administrative bureaucracy may be a problem, and where corporate exploitativeness is disguised by fairly widespread wealth. In general, this provocative book is more significant for the questions it raises -- we should worry all at once about forms of philosophical writing, an audience for philosophy, and the shape of general culture -- than for the recommendations it forwards.


[1]Stanley Cavell, "Foreword: An Audience for Philosophy," in Cavell, Must We Mean What We Say? (Charles Scribner's Sons, 1969), p. xxxi.

[2] J. L. Austin, Sense and Sensibilia (Clarendon Press, 1962), p. 8.