Victor Kumar and Richmond Campbell (“K & C” hereafter) have written an ambitious book. They set out not only to explain the evolutionary history of the “moral mind,” but also to draw lessons from this evolutionary history for the possibilities of moral progress among human beings today. The first, explanatory task is the focus of the first three sections: “Moral Apes,” “The Moral Mind,” and “Moral Cultures”; the second task is undertaken in the last section, “Moral Progress.”
I am afraid I found a great deal to criticize in this book, and not much to admire. The adaptationist story K & C tell about our ascent from our proto-moral primate ancestors is, despite their disclaimers (5), largely a “just-so” story, badly unconstrained by evidence. The conclusions they draw about the nature of human morality are poorly informed by contemporary research in cognitive and developmental psychology, linguistics, and interdisciplinary work on the nature of human language. K & C have an empiricist bias and ignore, or else cursorily dismiss, nativist alternatives that the reader should at least be made aware of. In general, K & C oversimplify many complex and highly controversial issues, asserting or presupposing consensus on matters that are very much still open to debate. The last three chapters, on the achievement of and prospects for moral progress, are historically and politically simplistic, and, frankly, insulting to those who have struggled and continue to struggle today to understand and to eliminate racism, sexism, homophobia, and other social malignancies. Space limitations prevent me from discussing every problem I find in this book, so I will focus on key issues in Chs. 1–5, and finish with a brief explanation of my objections to Chs. 8–10. I’ll start with a summary of their evolutionary story.
K & C begin with what they call “ape morality”—a collection of sentimental and behavioral dispositions observed to be present in both modern humans and modern apes, and hence presumed to have been present also in our common ancestors. Ape morality comprises what K & C call the “reactive emotions”: sympathy, loyalty, and some version of altruism. But then how did the moral psychology of homo sapiens come to diverge so significantly from this ancestral core?
According to K & C, the component elements of mature human morality—a suite consisting of “core moral emotions,” “core moral norms,” and a “core capacity for open-ended moral reasoning”—emerged gradually and piecemeal, through many iterations of group selection, in response to adaptive pressures inherent in the increasing size and complexity of hominin social groupings. The most significant ecological challenge facing our ancestors was the need for non-violent means of resolving intra-group conflict, in response to which arose two sets of new emotions: “collaborative emotions” (trust and respect) and “reactive emotions” (guilt and resentment). The former “enable[d] more complex forms of cooperation” (37) than were possible for our ape cousins, and the latter “reinforced assistance and collaboration” (37). Perhaps most notably, this enriched emotional repertoire “allowed humans to reciprocate with one another on terms of relative equality” (37), creating a social state of being that, as K & C characterize it, seems Edenic:
. . . humans cared for fellow group members more consistently; collaborated on childrearing, hunting, warfare, and defense; reliably settled conflicts for resources and dominance; and more generally, enjoyed relatively peaceful and cooperative lives within their local communities. (37)
The next step in moral development, according to K & C, was the emergence of moral norms. Ever-increasing social complexity generated selective pressure for greater and greater intelligence, i. e., “flexible and precise way[s] to coordinate behavior,” and this enabled the formulation and promulgation of rules (63). These rules did not become biologically encoded, K & C tell us; rather, they were transmitted within and across generations by “cultural evolution.” At some point two other important human traits began to emerge and develop: language and reason. Both of these faculties, K & C tell us, were adaptations, driven by social needs. “Linguistic communication evolved in large part because it offered powerful instruments for social learning” (105). “Reasoning evolved because it helped our ancestors acquire knowledge together” (106). Sometime during this developmental period, a form of reasoning specific to—or at least specifically adapted for—morality arose: “consistency reasoning,” which “sustains open-ended and flexible cooperation” (13).
K & C continue: once homo sapiens emerged, about 100,000 years ago, culture took off, and became a major evolutionary force of its own “by adding, in increments, new cultural software to old bio-cultural hardware” (129). (I confess I don’t know what this means other than that human brains enabled their owners to learn things.) One crucial cultural innovation was social institutions (129), which enabled ancient humans to form larger, more complexly cooperative groups—tribes. It was at this point, K & C inform us, that our ancestors achieved “behaviorally modern minds” (129).
There are many problems with this story. One huge problem facing any theorist working on the evolution of human psychological traits is the dearth of evidence. We have skeletons of, and artifacts from, individuals from a variety of early hominin species, but these relics tell us virtually nothing (to put it mildly) about their minds, their emotions or their modes of social organization. Nonetheless, K & C speak authoritatively about the psychological and social characteristics of our (very!) distant relatives. They write, for example, that “moral norms were transmitted culturally for hundreds of thousands of years” (8) and that “our ancestors cultivated descendants who were sentimental rule-followers” (9). Or again, “Perhaps as early as when the first members of our genus were emerging in Africa millions of years ago, humans evolved new ‘collaborative emotions’ of trust and respect” (37).
What is sorely missing here is not just direct evidence for such extravagant claims, but even an idea of what such evidence might look like. There are a great many citations in the early chapters, but the interested reader will find it challenging to get the details, since K & C rarely give page or even chapter references to the major works they cite, leaving it to the reader to look up the arguments for themself. For example, the authors claim, in the text, that in the groupings of “late humans” (possibly including H. heidelbergensis), “Grandmothers, aunts, and fathers contributed more and more to childcare” (62). In support of this claim, the authors cite Sarah Blaffer Hrdy’s 2009 book Mothers and Others: The Evolutionary Origins of Mutual Understanding. I looked it up. Hrdy has no direct evidence about family life pre-Pleistocene—how could she? Her argument turns out to be, like those of other anthropologists K & C rely on (such as Boyd & Richerson and Robin Dunbar), a retropolation from data on historic and extant human foraging societies or from other primate societies. They also rely on informed, but hypothetical accounts by philosophers (e.g., Kim Sterelny) and psychologists (e.g., Michael Tomasello).
But it is simply not enough to support a claim that a trait is an adaptation to give a plausible account of how the appearance of the trait in a group might have afforded the organisms in that group a selective advantage over others who lacked it. K & C explicitly call out this style of reasoning, and insist that their own theory is not a mere “just-so” story (5). But their own account fails to provide the kind of specific evidence needed to evade this charge. To assert that some phenotypic property is an adaptation is, in biology, an empirical hypothesis, and one that is not easy to defend. To begin with, one must show that the property in question is a trait. This is not trivial—vide the notorious case of the chin. Yet K & C assume, without argument, that various elements of moral psychology—emotions like empathy, loyalty, trust, and regret, concepts like “ought” and “equality,” and patterns of thinking like “consistency reasoning” are separable traits that evolved piecemeal. They also treat “reasoning” and language as separable, both from each other, and from other moral elements, and posit a separate adaptationist history for each. One possibility they simply ignore is that some or all of these properties and capacities are part of a single pleiotropic package.
Another pitfall to adaptationist thinking is attributing directionality to evolution. K & C surely know that nature has no intentionality, that natural selection is a filter, not an inventor, and that the environment cannot evoke useful mutations. However, they persistently write in a way that encourages these ways of thinking. Consider these examples:
Culturally transmitted information . . . was so important for our survival that there was selection on our brains to evolve cognitive capacities designed specifically to take advantage of it. (72)
. . . natural selection remodeled human brains for the sake of enhanced social plasticity. [emphasis in original] (105)
Another, related problem is K & C’s tendency to treat “fitness” as a normative notion. This is particularly acute once they begin talking about cultural evolution, which they repeatedly insist is “Darwinian” (e.g., 133, 136, 141). Their official line is that the currency of cultural evolution is “information” (64), and that the measure of cultural fitness is not number of biological offspring, but number of “students”— that is, the number of individuals who accept the information in question (73, 86). But K & C quickly and persistently conflate this normatively neutral and evolutionarily respectable sense of “fitness” with the normatively loaded and misconceived idea that the “fittest” ideas are also the best—the ones most likely to be useful. Fire, they write, spread through “cultural evolution” “Because it was manifestly so useful” (67). In general, they continue, there is a “tendency to imitate individuals who are successful, [so] the information they possess is more likely to be transmitted to others.” Hence, “Successful individuals . . . have high cultural fitness” (67). “Successful” here must be independent of “culturally fit” or the claim would be vacuous. K & C concede that “in modern societies . . . what counts as ‘success’ has become disentangled from the ability to survive and reproduce” (vaccine denial?), but they hold it as obvious that things must have been different in our prehistory: “Standards of success that didn’t track reproductive fitness [LA: biological fitness?] would not have lasted long” (68). (There is, by the way, no evidence cited in support of any of these claims.) This conflation of the normative and the descriptive reaches its apotheosis in Ch. 8.6, where K & C argue that we, as a species, should be wary of political radicals and not try to “implement their visions of society in one fell swoop,” because the process of “Darwinian cultural evolution . . . is much smarter than any of the individuals that occupy some of its nodes” (223). (I wondered at this point if the abolition of the centuries-old practice of chattel slavery in 1865 counts, to K & C, as the kind of “massive re-design” of “institutional moralities that they warn against.) Summing up, K & C quip that “reality has an inherent progressive bias” (195).
One final problem with reliance on this sort of post hoc adaptationist argument is that there may be many different equally plausible stories to tell about which aspect of the environment exercised the selective pressure. So among theorists who believe that language was an adaptation—and there is, contra K & C, no consensus about this—there is still disagreement about what language was for. Reduction of communication errors (Nowack and Krakauer, 1999)? transmission of information (Pinker and Bloom, 1990)? Efficient group bonding (Dunbar, 2003)? Coordination of hunting? Attracting mates (Fitch 2010; Kolodny and Edelman 2018)? Mediating thought and external expression (Berwick and Chomsky, 2016)? Indeterminacy of function can, in general, be somewhat reduced by examining cases of convergent evolution to look for ecological similarities in the environments of unrelated organisms that display the trait—e.g., leaflessness among desert plants (Futuyma 1986, 252–3). But since human morality is sui generis—as are human cognition and human language—there aren’t homologues to be found (Lewontin 1998).
The one non-retrospective argument offered by K & C for their claim that morality is an adaptation is that it is or involves a complex mechanism. K & C claim to recognize that “not all human traits are adaptations,” but they except “traits that exhibit ‘adaptive complexity,’” writing that in such cases, “Darwinian explanations are inescapable” (5, my emphasis). Traits with adaptive complexity are “composed of a set of interlocking mechanisms that could not exist except for the fact that they perform a crucial function” (5, my emphasis). I will set aside the fact that there is, contrary to the authors’ confident pronouncements, no consensus that an appeal to adaptation is either necessary or sufficient to explain complexity. I’ll also leave aside the circularity inherent in pre-classifying a set of traits as possessing adaptive complexity in order to argue that these traits are adaptations, because there’s a more fundamental circularity.
One might have thought that the way to defend the “adaptive complexity” of a phenotypic trait would be to start with a detailed account of the trait under investigation. But K & C foreswear any survey of existing work on the psychology of morality: “we don’t wish to dive too deep into the vast, fascinating, and often bewildering scientific literature on moral judgment” (101). (“WHY NOT?” I wrote in the margin.) Instead, they maintain that highly contested questions about the nature of the human moral faculty—for example, how central emotion is to our moral judgments—can be settled by appeal to the “fact” that the moral mind is “evolved”: “evolutionary science does more than explain where we came from. It also promises to show us who we are and why” (1). But here’s the circle: their justification of their strictly adaptationist story presupposes their central claims about human morality—that morality is based as much on sentiment as on reason, that moral emotions are separate from each other, that morality is “pluralistic” rather than unified, and that the involvement of language and analytical thought are incidental rather than intrinsic. But this view of morality is what the adaptationist story was supposed to yield.
K & C do cite evidence from developmental psychology when it fits their story. So they appeal to work described by Paul Bloom (in Just Babies, 2013) on the innateness of certain moral emotions (47), but do not mention the work he discusses in the same volume that supports the innateness of a human sense of and preference for equality. They also cite approvingly work by Joshua Greene (100) and some by Jonathan Haidt (94–5), whose work on puzzling patterns of judgment in trolley cases K & C claim as support for their “moral pluralism” (84), according to which interactions among (possibly competing) moral norms and moral emotions preclude any systematic answer to meta-ethical questions.
In ignoring the current state of play in both psychology and philosophy, K & C neglect important alternatives to their own account of human morality that deserve discussion, and that the reader deserves to learn about. K & C have a strong empiricist bias, so they either ignore or disparage psychological and philosophical theories that posit innate structure at the heart of human morality. Although they are happy to accept the innateness of moral emotions, they give the reader the impression that nativism about norms is a dead letter. In this regard they disagree with Haidt and Graham who hold that “each of the core moral norms is innately programmed in our brains.” This, K & C proclaim, is “mistaken”: “core moral norms are not innate” (94). Their reasoning here presumes that the only argument for positing native moral structure is the need to explain “what different moralities have in common” (94). But this presumption about the methodology behind nativist views is false. K & C ignore poverty-of-stimulus arguments, the most powerful methodological tool there is for defending nativist hypotheses.
More to the point, there are interesting theories of moral nativism, appealing to multiple sources of evidence, that K & C simply ignore. For example, Susan Dwyer (2006; 2010) and John Mikhail (2007) have each argued that there are striking parallels between the structure and development of morality on the one hand and language on the other, suggesting that there is a “universal moral grammar” analogous to the “universal grammar” posited by Chomsky and presumed by most contemporary syntacticians. Mikhail’s work is particularly germane here because of K & C’s emphasis on trolley problems. Mikhail offers a detailed explanation of judgment patterns in these cases—and the patterns are staggeringly complex—in terms of differences in the application order of two moral principles—a prohibition against battery (which K & C include in their model) and the Doctrine of Double-Effect. Mikhail’s account not only gives a deontological alternative to Greene’s emotionally-inflected consequentialism, but is consistent with empirical findings that show the same pattern of judgment (yes to Trolley, no to Footbridge) in small children in cases that do not involve the “up-close-and-personal” contacts that Greene’s account requires (Saunders 2014).
I am not claiming to know the facts about the structure of human moral judgment, much less its evolutionary history. My complaint against K & C is that they culpably misrepresent the state of knowledge about these matters, giving the reader the false impression that there is consensus in areas that are rife with controversy (is language an adaptation?) or that certain alternatives (deontology, nativism) have been decisively refuted.
I’ll turn, finally, to the third part of the book, where the authors present their assessment of the degree of moral progress we human beings have achieved, an explanation of how such progress occurred, and a broad program for moving even farther forward. I am very sorry to say this section is appallingly superficial. The authors’ “Theory of Moral Progress” is simple: injustice is the result of segregation, and justice is achieved when segregation is overcome. This will happen when privileged individuals are brought into the right kind of contact with members of disadvantaged groups, as they then come to see and understand the suffering of these groups and are motivated to make changes. Thus (in the authors’ telling) slavery was abolished when white people learned, from contact with Black victims of enslavement, how deeply such persons suffered (205–6); women began to gain power when men came into contact with women who held leadership positions (232); gay marriage and other pro-LGBTQ reforms came about because straight people discovered that many of their family members and friends were homosexual (212); and the animal rights movement gained momentum when those who came into close contact with non-human animals recognized the immense pain caused by human exploitation of animals through (for example) factory farming (219–20).
One problem with this theory is that it is so vague as to be almost unevaluable. But in the few cases where it does seem to make clear predictions, the predictions seem to be false. For example, slaveholders and their families had regular, close—often intimate—contact with the persons they enslaved, and yet “the peculiar institution” thrived for generations in the South. Men typically have close contact with women, yet discrimination and misogynistic violence have been the norm in most if not all human societies. Farmers and ranchers have closer contact with animals than many animal-rights activists, yet often view their cattle and chickens in a completely instrumental way. (My childhood friends who grew up on farms in rural Massachusetts made fun of my “sentimentality” when I worried that cows suffered when separated from their calves—this, in their view, was simply a necessary practice in commercial dairy production.) K & C anticipate the first two instances of these problems, and solve them by introducing new forms of segregation. Although enslaved persons were not physically segregated from their “owners,” they did suffer from role segregation (231). Men and women, although they usually share homes and engage in close physical contact, nonetheless have also been separated by “role segregation.” Oppressed individuals of all sorts are victims of “democratic segregation”—segregation in “decision-making roles within various social institutions” (238). K & C seem to believe that they have discovered this form of segregation: it is an “important factor in moral evolution that has so far been invisible” (238).
Insofar as the authors’ explanations of moral progress are at all substantive, they are reductive and ahistorical. Consider, for example, the history of the abolition of slavery in the United States. While the authors would have you believe that slavery was abolished largely because of a sea change in public awareness of its brutality (although the only cited writing is Harriet Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin, hardly a cri de coeur from an abused Black person), the actual course of events in the United States was a tangle of political and tactical moves, with the main actors only sometimes motivated by abolitionist principle. Abraham Lincoln did not campaign on abolition; nor was it a stated war aim of the Union. The Emancipation Proclamation (which of course only abolished slavery in the seceding states) was a tactic of war; and the 13th Amendment was, similarly, a political expedient to prevent the domination of Congress by newly re-admitted Southern states. Such abolitionist measures as were taken during the war had to confront widespread and vehement opposition by Democrats as well as members of Lincoln’s own party. As late as 1862, Lincoln argued for emancipation by linking it to an emigration scheme whereby free blacks would leave the U. S. for a government-financed colony in Central America (see McPherson, 1988, Ch. 16).
The authors’ explanation for the demise of slavery largely ignores the centuries of often mortal struggle by enslaved and formerly enslaved persons, along with the often violent activism of abolitionists, like John Brown. As for the impact of testimony, the authors mention only the impact of a single work by a white woman, thereby erasing the voices of scores of enslaved or formerly enslaved persons who advocated eloquently and, in many cases, effectively, for their own liberation. They also ignore the fact that many of these Blacks made their cases on the basis of principle rather than emotion. Elizabeth (neé “Bett”) Freeman, for example, successfully sued for her freedom in 1781 on the grounds that slavery was inconsistent with the newly-ratified Massachusetts Constitution and Quock Walker, a self-emancipated person, won a 1791 lawsuit against his former enslaver.
Looking to the future, K & C offer broad suggestions, not, as they repeatedly insist, “policy solutions”(240). I found these suggestions to be simplistic and historically naïve. Again, the history—and appalling vitality—of racism in this country makes it stunningly obvious that it is not and never has been an epistemic failure on the part of white people that accounts for the systematic and often brutal oppression of Black people in this country. As has been long recognized by Black writers and activists, as well as by feminists, animal rights activists, and advocates for global justice, if privileged people don’t see the suffering of others, it’s only because they do not want to. In general, for anyone who is politically awake in today’s world, K & C’s advice is simply banal. Their advice to those who would end “democratic segregation” in our political institutions is to seek “wider participation from a wider range of people” (238). Gee, why didn’t EVERY ACTIVIST ORGANIZATION THAT EVER EXISTED think of that? It’s hardly a new idea that a durably just society requires the empowerment of marginalized groups—one hardly needs to know anything about Darwin to see that.
And here’s the final irony: the material in the third part of the book has nothing to do with Darwin, unless, that is, one counts the misused notion of “fitness” that looms large in the discussion of progress. If I were forced to draw a moral lesson from the operation of natural selection, it would be this: evolution has tunnel-vision; it acts only in the short term and cannot envision, nor work, for states of affairs that do not yet exist. So the advice for us humans would be: don’t “let nature take its course.” Instead, use the tools we possess that evolution doesn’t: reason, imagination, and moral concern.
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