A Brief History of Analytic Philosophy: from Russell to Rawls

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Stephen P. Schwartz, A Brief History of Analytic Philosophy: from Russell to Rawls, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 349pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780470672082.

Reviewed by Aaron Preston, Valparaiso University


Over the last two decades or so, the history of analytic philosophy has come into its own as an important philosophical sub-discipline. A majority of the research has focused on isolated figures and factions,[1] but some works take a more holistic approach, addressing the analytic tradition qua tradition (or school, or movement, etc.). Works of this latter sort fall mainly into three categories: anthologies of primary-sources,[2] collections of essays,[3] and monographs. All of these are broader in historical scope than works focused on isolated figures and factions, but very few qualify -- or even aspire -- to be genuine histories of analytic philosophy. The monographs tend to be preoccupied with defining analytic philosophy or establishing some claim about its nature, and this usually constrains their historical coverage both in scope and in detail. [4] The anthologies and collections are usually too spotty in their historical coverage to count as full-fledged histories and, even where spottiness is not such a problem, the topics covered are not systematically integrated in the manner of a comprehensive historical overview.

Thus, while there are now many fine works available on various topics in the history of analytic philosophy, few of these have the right mix of breadth, detail, and integration to count as straightforwardhistories of analytic philosophy. In fact, only two recent works have even approximated these desiderata: Avrum Stroll's Twentieth Century Analytic Philosophy and Scott Soames' Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century.[5] Schwartz's book belongs alongside these as a genuine history of analytic philosophy, and it fills an important niche in this category as an introductory textbook for those new to analytic philosophy (or even to philosophy). Later I will attempt to bring this out by comparing Schwartz' Brief History with these other two. But first we turn to an overview of its contents.

The main body of the book consists of eight chapters. The first seven focus on issues in logic, the philosophy of language, metaphysics and epistemology central to analytic philosophy's origination and development, while the eighth focuses on ethics. These are accompanied by a brief preface, an introduction, and an epilogue in which Schwartz reflects on some broader themes, such as the nature and future of analytic philosophy. The first seven chapters form the book's main historical narrative. This begins (Chapter 1) with a discussion of Russell's early work in logic and the philosophy of language, with Frege, Whitehead and Meinong make cameos. Logicism and the system of Principia Mathematica, Russell's paradox, his theory of definite descriptions in "On Denoting", and his development of logical atomism all receive treatment. Attention then turns to Moore's philosophy of common sense, his and Russell's early views on sense-data, and their rebellion against British Hegelianism.

Chapters 2 and 3 cover the rise and fall of ideal language philosophy, from Wittgenstein's Tractatus to its appropriation by the logical positivists of the Vienna Circle, their problems with the verification principle of meaning, and the rise of Quinean naturalism. After a brief introduction to the cultural situation in 1920s Vienna, Chapter 2 surveys some main themes from the Tractatus, showing how it inspired logical positivism's anti-metaphysical project and its verification principle of meaning. Logical positivism itself is introduced mainly via a discussion of Ayer's Language, Truth, and Logic and Carnap's Aufbau. Schwartz balances attention to the school's doctrines with attention to the school as a social entity, moving back and forth between the development of thought within the group, and the development and eventual demise of the group in its social context. The chapter closes with a brief section concerning logical positivism's influence on the natural and social sciences.

Chapter 3 focuses less on social context and more on theoretical issues concerning the nature of empiricism. It surveys the conceptual problems with the verification criterion of meaning, and then segues into an overview of Quine's philosophy, including his rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction, his holism, the Quine-Duhem thesis, the indeterminacy of translation, and his views on metaphysics, epistemology and science (including a helpful comparison with Kuhn). Throughout, Schwartz is keen to emphasize Quine's relationships both to logical positivism and to American pragmatism. Connections are made not only to Carnap, but also to James, Dewey, Goodman, Rorty, and Putnam, with the latter three each receiving a short section of the chapter. The chapter closes with a section on Davidson's worries about the "third dogma of empiricism", the idea of conceptual schemes.

Chapters 4 and 5 cover the rise and fall of ordinary language philosophy. Chapter 4 focuses on the later Wittgenstein, Austin, Ryle, and Strawson, but G.E. Moore, Anscombe, Sellars, Chisholm, Searle, Cavell, Hart, Hare and Stevenson all receive mention, and some of them sustained discussion. Schwartz first describes the basic methodological orientation common to ordinary language philosophers, including the theory that meaning is use and the rejection of formal logic as an "ideal language." He illustrates these themes using examples mainly from Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations and from a variety of Austin's writings, but also occasionally from Ryle and Strawson. Along the way, he introduces important concepts from Wittgenstein's later philosophy such as "language game," "form of life," "family resemblance," and "rule following," as well as Austin's theory of speech acts. Schwartz then illustrates how ordinary language philosophers applied their method in thinking about the nature of mind (looking to Ryle's The Concept of Mind, Strawson's Individuals, and Wittgenstein's private language argument) and about sense data theory (looking mainly to Austin's Sense and Sensibilia, but also to Sellars and Chisholm). Throughout, Schwartz is careful to show how these developments relate to prior phases in the analytic tradition, as well as to movements outside of philosophy such as behaviorism in psychology.

Chapter 5 details responses to ordinary language philosophy, both at the level of its basic methodology and in its application to the philosophy of mind. Schwartz first describes how the work of Gödel, Tarski and, later, Chomsky, inspired new formal approaches in philosophy. Discussions of Gödel's incompleteness theorem, Tarski's concepts of object-language, meta-language, and satisfaction, and Chomsky's ideas about innateness, compositionality and the creative aspect of language use are integrated with discussions of Grice's theory of conversational implicature and of Davidson's philosophy of language. Schwartz then surveys the latter's consequences both for the positivist/Quinean tradition and for ordinary language philosophy, as well as Dummett's responses to Davidson. Finally, Schwartz discusses post-behaviorist developments in the philosophy of mind, including the rise of functionalism, Davidson's anomalous monism, and challenges to these such as qualia, mental content, and mental causation.

Chapters 6 and 7 focus on the impact of modal logic and possible worlds semantics in shaping the more recent phases of the analytic tradition. Chapter 6 begins with a discussion of the development of this conceptual apparatus from Carnap's original formulation, through Quine's objections, to answers and applications from Kripke, Plantinga, Lewis, Marcus, and Stalnaker. The focus throughout is on the relation of these innovations to the rebirth of metaphysics in the analytic context. Specifically, Schwartz discusses their relation to essentialism, to debates about modal realism, to the problem of transworld identity, and to modal versions of the ontological argument. Chapter 7 explores the application of modal logic and possible worlds semantics to issues in the philosophy of language. Specifically, it focuses on the "new theory of reference" as developed by Kripke, Putnam, and Donnellan, and its application by the first two to issues in the philosophy of mind. As is his practice throughout the book, Schwartz is careful to note not only the advantages of, but also the challenges to, these views.

Finally, chapter 8 covers ethics in the analytic tradition, from Moore's Principia Ethica through the non-cognitivism of Stevenson and Hare to the return of substantive ethics as exemplified by Anscombe and Foot, and the rise of applied ethics as exemplified by Peter Singer. The chapter closes with an overview of Rawls' A Theory of Justice, with cameos by Popper and Nozick.

As this overview reveals, Schwartz squeezes considerable breadth into what is -- as his title promises -- a brief history of analytic philosophy. In this regard, comparison with Stroll and Soames favors Schwartz. Both Stroll and Soames have been criticized for being too selective in their coverage; one reviewer even claims that Soames' work fails as a history for failing to satisfy the desidratum of sufficient breadth.[6] In my view, this sets the bar too high: both Stroll and Soames cover enough of analytic philosophy's central ideas and developments to qualify as histories of the school. But Schwartz is broader than either of them, while coming in at only about forty pages longer than Stroll, and nearly six hundred pages shorter than Soames' two volumes.

However, there are tradeoffs to be made among breadth, detail, and length. The slight difference in length between Stroll and Schwartz is not reflected in a substantial difference in the level of detail, but the kinds of details differ. Stroll focuses more than the other two on biographical details, sometimes to the detriment of the philosophical details, and for precisely this reason he has been charged with failure to write an adequate philosophical history.[7] The massive disparity in length between Schwartz and Soames, however, is due largely to the greater level of philosophical detail in Soames' work.

But here it is important to note that the value of detail varies with one's purposes, and that sometimes "less is more." Schwartz' purpose is "to provide a general overview of the leading philosophers, theories, movements, and controversies of analytic philosophy, as well as some idea of its cultural, political, and social setting" (xi, my emphasis), and his book is clearly intended to be used as a textbook for students and philosophical novices. It is made "user-friendly" not only by its generality and brevity, but also by a number of other features. Schwartz maintains an easy style throughout, and occasionally adopts an informal tone (for instance, noting the popularity of Latinate titles among the early Cambridge analysts, Schwartz jokes that "they had to flaunt that Latin they learned in the English 'public' schools even if they couldn't get away with writing their books in Latin," 29, n.). Schwartz also includes what he calls "background snippets" -- essentially substantial endnotes providing information useful for novices. Each of these appears in its own grey-shaded box at the end of the chapter to which it is relevant (presumably the boxes are meant to appear less daunting than a numbered list of notes in small print). Also at the end of each chapter is an annotated list of suggested readings. All of this makes the text quite approachable for readers with no prior knowledge of analytic philosophy, or, for that matter, philosophy.

In my view, Schwartz succeeds very well in providing a general overview of the history of analytic philosophy. But for some people, or for some purposes, it may be too general. Returning to the comparison with Soames: Soames' volumes grew out of a course for advanced undergraduates and beginning graduate students at Princeton, and they are probably the best choice for teaching similar courses to similar students at similar institutions, as well as for scholarly purposes. But for pedagogical purposes in other contexts, the generality and brevity of Schwartz' book may make it the better option. When Soames' volumes appeared, some heralded it as sure to become, for good or for ill, the definitive history of analytic philosophy. Schwartz's book does not challenge Soames' volumes on that score, but it is, in my estimation, the most useful introduction to the history of analytic philosophy currently available for a general audience.

Of course, a book sufficiently broad, detailed, and integrated to count as (aspiring to be) a genuine history of analytic philosophy can still fail through being inaccurate, a charge that has been leveled at both Stroll and Soames.[8] When Soames' history first appeared, it was roundly criticized for perpetuating interpretations of early analysts that, although traditional, had been overturned by recent historical scholarship -- especially by the sort pertaining to isolated figures and factions within the analytic tradition. Like Soames, Schwartz seems to have paid only scant attention to the outpouring of this type of historical research over the last two decades. Schwartz makes reference to Stroll and Soames, and (using the categories I introduces at the outset) to one monograph (Glock, 2008) and one collection (Martinich and Sosa, 2005), but that is all. This raises the worry that Schwartz's commitment to giving "standard, accepted interpretations" (xii) of the figures and ideas he discusses may not translate into his giving historically accurate interpretations.

One place this worry crops up is in Schwartz's treatment of Russell. He explains the significance of Russell's early work in logic by relating it to the challenge posed to empiricism by synthetic a prioriknowledge. The idea is that Russell paved the way for Wittgenstein's reduction of logical truth to tautology, and that this was a great triumph for empiricism. However, Russell himself experienced this as a demoralizing defeat. As Russell noted in one of his autobiographical pieces:

my intellectual journeys have been, in some respects, disappointing. When I was young I hoped to find religious satisfaction in philosophy; even after I had abandoned Hegel, the eternal Platonic world gave me something non-human to admire. I thought of mathematics with reverence, and suffered when Wittgenstein led me to regard it as nothing but tautologies.[9]

Now, Schwartz actually quotes this last sentence (16), noting Russell's dismay. However, he does not relate that dismay to the quasi-Platonic "propositional realism" which Russell mentions here, and which he (and Moore) endorsed during the period when he was making the very contributions to logic and the philosophy of language that Schwartz discusses. The closest he comes to it is a footnote (28) in which he describes Russell as "although freed of Hegelianism . . . still struggling to emerge from metaphysical intoxication." In fact, Russell was not struggling against his Platonism at all -- Wittgenstein dragged him quite unwillingly away from it. And, given both the thrust of Schwartz's presentation and his intended audience, it would be easy for readers to come away with the impression that Russell was at the time working within the empiricist tradition, trying to eliminate the last remaining bastions of synthetic a priori knowledge. The result is a skewed picture of Russell.

How significant is this type of problem? I admit to being somewhat ambivalent about it. On the one hand, it seems obvious that broad and relatively coarse-grained historical narratives should be grounded as much as possible in the relevant fine-grained historical research. On the other hand, philosophical schools, movements and traditions are not merely collections of fine-grained facts. There are facts about the relations among members, and possibly also coarse-grained, "institutional" facts, relevant to the history of a tradition that do not emerge from fine-grained analyses of isolated figures and factions. And there is no guarantee that the facts at these two levels of granularity will be entirely consistent with one another. As a rule, the more closely one inspects any tradition or school, the more the differences among its members seem to stand out.

Arguably, historians of analytic philosophy face an especially difficult problem of this sort: close inspection reveals differences of such magnitude that one might well wonder whether there was ever an adequate rationale for holding the canonical analysts together as members of a single tradition or school. This, incidentally, is why so many of the monographs that take a more holistic approach to the history of analytic philosophy are preoccupied with definition -- because looking closely at the history of analytic philosophy inevitably raises problems about its unity as a school, movement, or tradition. Even Schwartz finds himself struggling with these matters in his Introduction (rather inadequately in my view -- witness his inability to explain in a principled way why he includes Frege, Gödel, Tarski, Turing and Chomsky on his list of "Leading Analytic Philosophers" when in fact he rightly does not regard them as analytic philosophers (6-7). He appeals to their influence in analytic circles, but then why not Peano, or even Hegel, insofar as negative influence is still influence?) .

The right approach to this problem is not clear. However, it seems clear enough that trying to reduce the history of the school to facts about is members and component factions is a wrong approach. It seems likewise clear that the production of holistic, coarse-grained histories of analytic philosophy is an endeavor both legitimate and needed. However, since one point of such a history is to explain how canonical analysts fit together into a group (a school or movement or tradition), and it is probably not possible to do this without minimizing some of the fine-grained differences -- or at least noting how those differences were minimized as part of the institution's history -- we need to be somewhat forgiving when a coarse-grained work minimizes or even ignores some of the fine-grained facts.

Consequently, I am less offended by problems like the above than others might be. I do not see them as reasons to reject the book, but rather to use it cautiously. Used as a textbook, someone competent in the history of analytic philosophy will be able to point out just where significant fine-grained facts are being minimized or ignored, and I imagine that pointing out these discrepancies could lead to good conversations about the deeper puzzle about the unity of analytic philosophy mentioned above. I think Schwartz would be happy with that result. As he indicates in his Preface, his book "is meant to be a start [on the history of analytic philosophy], not the final word" (xii). For many interested parties it will prove to be the best start currently available.

[1] E.g., Baldwin, G. E. Moore (Routledge, 1990); Griffin, Russell’s Idealist Apprenticeship, (Clarendon, 1991); Hylton, Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy (Clarendon, 1990); Hacker, Wittgenstein's Place in 20th Century Analytic Philosophy (Blackwell, 1996); Kenny, Frege: An Introduction to the Founder of Modern Analytic Philosophy (Blackwell, 2000).

[2] E.g., Ammerman, ed., Classics of Analytic Philosophy (Hackett, 1990); Martinich and Sosa, eds., Analytic Philosophy: An Anthology (Blackwell, 2001); Baillie, ed., Contemporary Analytic Philosophy: Core Readings (Prentice Hall, 2002).

[3] E.g., Monk and Palmer, eds., Bertrand Russell and the Origins of Analytical Philosophy (Thoemmes, 1996); Tait, ed., Early Analytic Philosophy: Frege, Russell, Wittgenstein (Open Court, 1997); Biletzki and Matar, eds., The Story of Analytic Philosophy: Plot and Heroes (Routledge, 1998); Reck, ed., From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy (Oxford, 2001); Martinich and Sosa, eds., A Companion to Analytic Philosophy (Wiley-Blackwell, 2005).

[4] E.g., Capaldi, The Enlightenment Project in the Analytic Conversation (Kluwer, 2000); Preston, Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion (Continuum, 2007); Glock, What is Analytic Philosophy? (Cambridge, 2008); Akehurst, The Cultural Politics of Analytic Philosophy (Continuum, 2010).

[5] Stroll, Twentieth Century Analytic Philosophy (Columbia University Press, 2000); Soames, Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, 2 vols. (Princeton University Press, 2003).

[6] Michael Beaney (Philosophical Books, 47(3), 255-271, 17, July 2006).

[7]See the review by Woller (Review of Metaphysics, 54(4), 945-946, 2001).

[8] On Stroll, see the review by Brad Majors (Auslegung, 25(1), 87-9, 2000).  On Soames, see the reviews by Pincock (Russell: The Journal of the Bertrand Russell Archives, 25(2), 167-171, Winter 2005-2006), Beaney (Philosophical Books, 47(3), 255-271, 17, July 2006) and Hacker (Philosophical Quarterly, 56(222), 121-131, January 2006).

[9] "My Mental Development," in Schilpp, ed. The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (Open Court, 1944, 3-20), p.19.