A Brief History of the Philosophy of Time

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Adrian Bardon, A Brief History of the Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 2013, 185pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199301089.


Reviewed by Kristie Miller, The University of Sydney


In terms of sheer physical heft this is not a weighty tome. Yet Adrian Bardon manages to cover a truly impressive array of issues in the philosophy of time ranging from an overview of some of the historical precursors of current ideas to a discussion of the most recent developments in the area. One might worry that a book that covers so much terrain will either be far too superficial or else presuppose far too much background knowledge and thus be inaccessible to all but those already in the know. But Bardon does an excellent job of making the issues thoroughly accessible whilst at the same time not shying away from the interesting and more difficult questions. Because he manages to walk this tightrope so well, the book would make an excellent resource for undergraduates, but would be equally at home in the bag of a graduate student.

Bardon's methodology is admirable. He melds traditional a priori arguments from metaphysics with empirical data from physics, cognitive science and evolutionary biology in order to evaluate which of a number of different views about the nature of time presents the most coherent picture of our world. Sometimes metaphysics is criticised for being out of touch with science or, it is argued, properly done metaphysics is nothing but science. Bardon's book is valuable for being a very good introduction to the philosophy of time, but also because it shows why metaphysics does not collapse into science and why metaphysics without science cannot tell us about our world (even if it can, perhaps, tells us about the space of all possible worlds without locating us in one of those worlds).

In assessing different views about the nature of time -- most especially those according to which time is dynamical, or, alternatively, according to which time is not dynamical -- Bardon considers both a priori arguments from metaphysics as well as arguments that appeal to empirical data from physics. He presents, in a very clear manner, both the a priori reasons for, and against, the thesis that time flows: that there is a special now with some objective property that sets it apart from times and events in the past and those in the future, and such that which moment is now changes as time passes. Consideration of whether there is any coherent model according to which different moments have different A-theoretic properties takes us well beyond what physics can tell us about the world. For if it can be shown that there is no such model -- that it is inconsistent to suppose that different moments are first future, then present, then past -- then we have learned not just that time in the actual world is not dynamical, but that there is no world in which time is dynamical. Here we see a priori metaphysics at work answering questions that physics is simply not in the business of answering.

Bardon's assessment of dynamical and non-dynamical theories of time also includes a critique of how each meshes with our current account of the physics of our world. In doing so he makes accessible some basic, foundational material in physics about the nature of space-time. Bardon presupposes no prior knowledge of physics, and there is a very comprehensible overview of this material including a characterisation of how general and special relativity imply a particular model of space-time and what implications that has for our view of time. Later there is a useful discussion of the question whether time has a direction and what light, if any, thermodynamics can shed on that question. For those who find physics and philosophy of physics hard going this is a very approachable introduction to targeted issues in the philosophy of time. It nicely shows how empirical data can be used to critique theories in metaphysics and illustrates why we cannot theorise about the nature of time entirely from the armchair.

Though Bardon makes clear that his own view is that a non-dynamical theory is to be preferred given considerations arising both from metaphysics and from physics -- so the book is not entirely non-partisan -- he is, by and large, fair to both sides of the debate. There are, unsurprisingly, places where other philosophers of time will disagree with Bardon's assessment of the merits of an argument, or with his conclusions about which view is strongest. To get a very brief taste of some of these disputes, it's worth considering two issues. The first is the relationship between special relativity and a dynamical theory of time. Bardon concludes that if relativity is right, then the dynamical theory of time must be wrong. For what it's worth, as another partisan participant to this debate, Bardon and I are entirely in agreement about which theory of time is the stronger. But it is worth noting that not everyone will accept that the theory of relativity is incompatible with a dynamical theory of time. At least, if one thinks of the theory of relativity as including the claim that no frame of reference is physically privileged then it is open to the dynamist to hold that one and only one frame of reference is, nevertheless, metaphysically privileged. That is the frame that, as it were, gets the ordering of events right. This would be the view that there is one correct foliation of space-time into a set of instants and, of that set, just one of those instants is objectively now, and the rest are past (those earlier than now) and future (those later than now). Those who reject such a view likely think that writing in by hand that there is such a metaphysically privileged frame of reference is not motivated by the best scientific theory, and thus is methodologically suspect. But those who think there are other strong independent motivations for a dynamical theory will argue that positing such a metaphysically privileged frame is, considered in the context of overall theory, well motivated.

Another place where some might take issue with Bardon is his discussion of time travel. There he suggests that the physical possibility of time travel (if indeed it is physically possible) would be a blow to the dynamist since time travel is incompatible with a dynamist account of time. The idea, according to the dynamist, is that there is one and only one path through time. If time travel were physically possible but incompatible with dynamism, then this would be a powerful argument that our world is not a dynamic one. Moreover, Bardon argues, if time travel is physically possible then even those who accept that time is static rather than dynamic have reason to rethink the idea that time has a direction since time travel would require that there are some cases in which later events cause earlier events.

It is uncontroversial that time travel into the past requires that later events are the cause of earlier events. It is, however, not so clear why the physical possibility of time travel would be a reason to doubt that time has a direction. There are, as Bardon considers, other reasons to doubt that time has a direction. But if one holds that time is static but that events are ordered by earlier-than and later-than relations, it is unclear why one should be concerned about the physical possibility of later events causing earlier events. Unless one also thought that the direction of time is reducible to the direction of causation, one can countenance the existence of backwards causation even if one thinks that time has a direction. It is just that some effects temporally precede their causes.

Indeed, even those who reject a static view of time in favour of a dynamic theory can, arguably, make perfectly good sense of the idea that time travel is physically possible. To be sure, the dynamist thinks that time passes and that there is an objective ordering of events into past, present and future and that which events are present changes as time flows. Nevertheless, it need be no part of a dynamical theory of time that backwards causation is impossible. After all, dynamists typically do not attempt to reduce the direction (or flow) of time to the direction of causal relations. So in principle they can accept that later events sometimes cause earlier events. Even the most extreme versions of a dynamical theory, such as presentism -- the view according to which only a single time exists -- can make sense of backwards time travel as long as the view can make sense of backwards causation. The presentist can simply note that when t is the present some person, P, exists at t with apparent memories of a time that does not yet exist. P is a time traveller just in case when some future time, t* comes into existence, P exists at t*, and it is P's existence at t* that is causally responsible for P's existence at t. To be sure, that makes P's life oddly temporally connected: later stages of P's life (later in P's own personal time) come into existence before earlier stages (earlier in P's own personal time) of P's life. That is to say, P is first older, and then younger. But there seems to be nothing incoherent in such a view.

Having said all that, no book of any interest can be completely noncontentious, and Bardon does justice to many different views in the philosophy of time. Moreover, by taking a particular stance on the viability of the dynamical theory he is prompted to consider issues that arise once we abandon the idea that time really does pass. In particular, we are left with the questions: why does the current moment, the now, seem particularly salient to us; why are we relieved by what has already passed, but not by what lies in our future; why does it seem to some that time passes? It is at this point that the book goes beyond what is often found in discussions of the philosophy of time, namely consideration of the nature of time itself, and moves on to consider how to make sense of the way the world seems to us as agents on the assumption that time is not dynamical.

Even those who are not particularly interested in the nature of time in itself should find this, and later, discussions of interest. Here, Bardon asks how we should reconcile what we take to be the nature of the world -- namely that it is a static block -- with the way the world seems to us. There are two quite separate discussions of this issue. The first focuses on our temporal phenomenology and attempts to explain why things seem the way they do to us by appealing to evolved features of our cognitive psychology. Here again Bardon brings together a priori reason and empirical data to present what he takes to be the strongest theory. There is much more to be said about the right way to spell out our temporal phenomenology and to account for its features, but Bardon presents a useful beginning to this discussion, a discussion that has until recently been lacking. In later sections he discusses further issues that arise when we attempt to reconcile the way things seem to us -- namely that we are free agents who reason, decide and act -- with the view that our world is one in which all future events exist in space-time. The worry is that if the future exists then all future contingents already have truth-values. But if it is already true that this, rather than that, will happen, and if this, rather than that, is some action of mine, then it looks as though I have no free will with respect to whether to do this, or that. Bardon presents a clear, interesting, discussion of fatalism in its various forms, and reflects on the extent to which those who think our word is a static block ought to be fatalists about their actions.

This is a book that does not dodge the big issues. Nor is it a book that leaves everything to science. Equally, it is not a book that shies away from the fact that science has a lot to tell us both about our own cognitive processes and the way we see the world, and about the way the world is, in itself. It appeals to a range of empirical findings and conjectures and takes seriously the idea that in coming to paint a full picture of our world and our place in it we need to fully amalgamate the findings of science with metaphysical enquiry. Moreover, because Bardon is interested not just in the nature of time as it is found in physics and metaphysics, but also in our place in a world that has time of that kind, the book will be of broad interest to those interested in how we, as agents in time, experience the world and how we explain the way we experience the world. Bardon focuses on question that go well beyond the issue of why we have the temporal phenomenology we do -- why it seems to us that time flows (if indeed it does) and why the now seems particularly important to us. He goes on to consider the question of whether, if certain views of time are correct, we as human agents have any freedom at all.