A Companion to Hume

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Elizabeth S. Radcliffe (ed.), A Companion to Hume, Blackwell, 2008, 573pp., $199.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405114554.

Reviewed by James A. Harris, University of St. Andrews


The flood of companions and handbooks and guides to the great philosophers and their works continues apace, and Hume already has his fair share. In 1993 David Fate Norton produced The Cambridge Companion to Hume, and there followed two volumes of the Ashgate 'International Library of Critical Essays in the History of Philosophy' dedicated to Hume, one on moral and political philosophy, one on 'general philosophy'. 2003 saw the publication of Peter Millican's Oxford University Press collection devoted to Hume's first Enquiry, Reading Hume on Human Understanding. Saul Traiger edited a Blackwell Guide to Hume's Treatise in 2006. In addition, there has been a steady flow of single-author books on Hume intended for students both undergraduate and graduate, including three volumes in the Routledge Philosophy Guidebook series, two volumes in the Continuum 'Reader's Guide' series, a Continuum 'Guide for the Perplexed', and so on. Don Garrett's second (revised) edition of the Cambridge Companion in the Routledge Philosophers series will be published in 2009, and possibly also Donald Ainslie's Cambridge Companion to Hume's Treatise. What, then, does Elizabeth Radcliffe's collection of specially commissioned essays contribute to the burgeoning genre of books on Hume specifically intended to be of use in teaching Hume to university students?

One distinctive feature of this Blackwell Companion to Hume is that it attempts to be more careful than is common with books of its sort to mark a distinction between explicating Hume's own ideas and arguments, and assessing their relevance to present-day philosophical discussion. This volume concludes with no less than six chapters under the heading 'Contemporary Themes', in which are discussed Hume on naturalism and scepticism, whether he is a realist or anti-realist, his epistemological legacy, his theory of motivation, his account of normativity, and his metaethics. This division between exegesis and philosophical criticism is to be applauded. It increases the chances, but of course does not guarantee, that Hume's philosophy will be carefully engaged with on its own terms, with proper recognition of context and of the possibility that Hume's concerns when treating a particular question might be different from ours now. It is perhaps also worth noting that, while the bulk of this collection's chapters (eighteen out of twenty-eight) are on topics in 'Mind and Knowledge', 'Passions and Action', 'Morality and Beauty', and 'Religion', there are three chapters given over to 'Economics, Politics, and History', in which Tatsuya Sakamoto, Richard Dees, and Mark Salber Phillips give elegant summaries of Hume's enormous achievements in those disciplines. Hume scholarship is less dominated by men than other areas of philosophy, so it is no surprise, though perhaps still disappointing, that eight of the twenty-eight chapters are by women. As was predictable, a substantial majority (eighteen) of the chapters are by scholars working in North America. This reviewer cannot help drawing attention to the fact that only two are by British scholars, both of whom teach in England. In general, there is a good mix of established figures and younger scholars.

The apportioning of chapters is as one has come to expect. Issues raised in Book I of the Treatise are given seven chapters, issues raised in Book II get three, and 'Morality and Beauty' has five. Religion is given three. Despite the preponderance of chapters on matters epistemological and metaphysical, there are some curious choices: there is a whole chapter on the distinction between memory and imagination, but no chapter on the character of Hume's scepticism (though there is discussion of it in Janet Broughton's chapter in the 'Contemporary Themes' section). Wayne Waxman's chapter on space and time is somewhat selective in its treatment of Treatise 1.2, and leaves out too much of that very difficult part of the Treatise. Not all of the chapters strike the right balance between exegesis and commentary on the state of the secondary literature. Louis Loeb concentrates on the latter in his chapter on inductive inference, while Michel Malherbe says almost nothing about the secondary literature in his treatment of belief in the external world. Topics from Book II of the Treatise are well covered, though there is to my mind too little attempt to relate Hume's analysis of the passions to earlier taxonomies. Students tend to find Book II the most difficult part of Hume's philosophy to make sense of. It is very hard to see what Hume's agenda is, and why he structures the Book as he does. Jane McIntyre provides an extremely helpful attempt at answering such questions in the Traiger Blackwell Guide to Hume's Treatise, but there is nothing similar here. Hume's moral philosophy is fairly comprehensively served, though there is not enough said about Hume's account of promising, and Eugenio Lecaldano neglects almost all of the secondary literature on Hume on justice. Annette Baier contributes a very thought-provoking comparison of Book III of the Treatise and the second Enquiry, which raises, but in the end refrains from answering, the question of why Hume judged the second Enquiry, of all his writings, 'incomparably the best'. There is quite a bit of overlap between the chapters on Hume's moral philosophy by Charlotte Brown, Kate Abramson, and Jacqueline Taylor. The section on religion is strong and well-balanced, with a chapter on intellectual and cultural contexts by Terence Penelhum, followed by accounts of the Dialogues by Martin Bell and of Hume on miracles by Michael Levine. One obvious weakness is a lack of sustained attention to Hume's writings on taste and art: they do not get even one whole chapter to themselves, and are discussed at any length only in Taylor's chapter 'Hume on Beauty and Virtue'.

The editor of A Companion to Hume, Elizabeth Radcliffe, writes in her introduction to the volume that 'The emphasis is on Hume's philosophy, although his work as a historian is represented as well' (p. 7). To my mind, this sets things off on the wrong foot. A sharp dichotomy between Hume's 'philosophy' and 'history' only makes sense given an anachronistic understanding of both of those disciplines. Hume's way of treating the understanding, the passions, and (especially) morals is profoundly historical. An empiricist after all, Hume intends to give a 'natural history' of individual consciousness, beginning with the most basic sensory inputs of the neonate mind and describing how habit and custom combine with elementary principles of association in order to generate beliefs in the uniformity of nature, the existence of an external world, and personal identity over time. He then turns to a complex dialectical relationship between self-consciousness and awareness of the opinions and sentiments of others as a means of explaining the coming into existence of the social realm. And after that he explains the origins of key features of the moral, political, and legal structure of that social realm using the resources offered by what would later be called 'conjectural history'. His interest in religion is historical too, as the Natural History of Religion makes perfectly clear. The moral of the Dialogues, written of course some time before the Natural History, is that reason is unable to account for the role that religion plays in human life, and so there is called for another kind of explanation, given in terms of a series of expressions of human ignorance, fear, and gullibility. Hume's philosophy is historical from beginning to end.

Moreover, as has often been remarked, sometimes as praise, sometimes as criticism, his history is through and through philosophical. In what I think is the single most interesting chapter of this collection, Mark Salber Phillips takes this obvious truth and refines it, moving beyond the idea, made familiar by the work of Duncan Forbes, of the History of England as a vehicle of ideological critique, towards a deeper understanding of the manner in which the complex formal features of Hume's narrative help to render comprehensible the full extent of his purposes as a historian of the English nation. Phillips begins with a thought-provoking comparison between Hume's History (culminating with the constitutional settlement of 1688-89) and Scott's Waverley, both written 'sixty years since': as he notes, where Scott indulged in the romance of the vanquished, Hume stripped bare the myths of the victors. Phillips also reminds us of the importance of distinguishing between, on the one hand, Hume's destruction of the self-deceiving myths of Whig historiography, and, on the other hand, his broadly sympathetic stance with respect to Whig political principle. Hume's disdain for the rhetoric of English political debate in the mid-eighteenth century should not be confused with sceptical neutrality as regards what was to be done if Britain were to take advantage of the new opportunities afforded by the opening up of genuinely international trade. Part of what it means to call the History of England a 'philosophical' history is, as Phillips suggests, to see it as designed to help his readers transcend the sordid political squabbles of the age in order that they better understand the potential contained within the combination of the constitutional settlement and a freeing up of commerce. In effect, this was history written in order to loosen the hold of history.

It is also unhelpful to imagine there to be a clear distinction between Hume's 'philosophy' and his writings on economics. Tatsuya Sakamoto discusses various ways in which the Political Discourses of 1752 draws on ideas and arguments from A Treatise of Human Nature, but the burden of his chapter concerns the ways in which Hume challenged the common sense of his age as regards the causes of national prosperity. It is almost definitional of philosophy as Hume understands it that it question the beliefs which come naturally. The agenda is not always, of course, to disabuse us of those beliefs, but the work of philosophy nevertheless is to interrogate the commonsensical, in order that it either be rejected or understand itself better. And where the commonsensical is to be rejected, there is the delicate and distinctively philosophical question of how to replace error and prejudice with beliefs properly grounded in experience. Hume's theory of money provides a perfect example of this kind of complex negotiation between common sense and philosophical analysis, as Hume first mounts a radical challenge to the idea that the wealth of an individual or a state is determined by the amount of money possessed, and then seeks to accommodate his new theory to a range of recalcitrant historical facts. Part of the definition of 'philosophy' is, for Hume, a regard for 'the general course of things', and a high degree of theoretical sophistication and abstraction, but a philosophical theory is only as good as the amount of particular cases it can explain, and explanation of particular cases is bound to involve qualification and refinement. In his political economy as in his history of England, Hume's goal is to help his age understand itself better, to help it see itself from a new and impartial vantage-point, and it is the construction of that vantage-point and the description of how things look from there that is the business of philosophy as Hume practises it.

A Companion to Hume opens with a chapter by Stephen Buckle on Hume's place in the larger movement known as the Enlightenment. Buckle's concern is principally with Hume in relation to the French Enlightenment, the Enlightenment of the philosophes, and he argues that once we widen our understanding of Hume's project to allow in more than a narrow range of issues in epistemology and metaphysics, we can see Hume as an ally of Voltaire, Diderot, d'Alembert, and company. 'No wonder, then,' Buckle remarks, 'that he was often their welcome dinner guest!' (p. 23) Like the French writers of the eighteenth century, Hume set the new scientific method of Bacon and Newton to work in the service of moral philosophy construed broadly enough to include both the philosophy of mind, as we would call it, and questions in politics and economics. For reasons that are never made clear, Buckle also thinks that Hume can be seen as sharing the 'materialist' agenda of the French philosophy of the age. This last claim strikes me as unconvincing in the extreme, and it brings into question what, exactly, it means to call Hume a philosopher of the Enlightenment. It is true that Hume often dined among the philosophes; but it is also true that, on one famous occasion, he was astonished to find not only that genuine atheists actually existed, but that he was sitting down to eat with a whole group of them. Where the French were dogmatic, Hume tended to be sceptical. I imagine that when talk turned to theology or metaphysics, Hume simply wanted to change the subject. No sense could be made of such questions either way, and there was no point in trying either to prove the existence of God or to articulate a viable form of atheism. This is not to say that Hume was not really at home among the philosophes, but he seems to have been much more at home with his friends among the 'moderate' clerics of Edinburgh. In general, the question of Hume's place in eighteenth-century Scottish thought is not properly raised in this volume, which is to be regretted.

I used A Companion to Hume as the main secondary source for an Honours course on the entirety of A Treatise of Human Nature, and I can report that my students did find it useful. On a previous occasion I recommended Saul Traiger's Blackwell Guide to Hume's Treatise, and that was found helpful too. Neither is absolutely perfect, but then what single such collection will ever be found perfect by anyone? There will soon be more such collections, and I imagine that the new Cambridge Companions, to Hume and to the Treatise, will be good teaching aids as well. Soon, it is to be hoped, it will be decided that enough is enough as regards handbooks, guides, companions, and so on (I write as the editor of a forthcoming Oxford Handbook) so that we can all get back to more serious business.