A Companion to Michael Oakeshott

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Paul Franco and Leslie Marsh (eds.), A Companion to Michael Oakeshott, Penn State University Press, 2012, 360pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271054070.

Reviewed by John Kekes, jonkekes@nycap.rr.com


The editors of this book rightly say that "the time is ripe to . . . come to provisional conclusions about the nature and significance of Oakeshott's multifarious philosophical contributions" (1). They have tried to do this by asking "a variety of Oakeshott scholars . . . each to write an essay on a particular aspect of Oakeshott's thought, summarizing its main features and assessing its ultimate significance" (1).

The volume includes an introduction by the editors and fifteen essays whose authors have published works on Oakeshott. The quality of their essays, judged by their success in contributing to the announced aim of this volume, is uneven. I divide my discussion of the essays into three groups: seven excellent, four mediocre, and four deficient.

First among the excellent contributions is Noël O'Sullivan's. The most difficult of Oakeshott's works is On Human Conduct. Its argument is complex and couched in a technical vocabulary borrowed from Latin. Not surprisingly, it has been widely misunderstood. O'Sullivan's essay is a most illuminating explanation of what the book is about. I recommend it without reservation to all who want to understand Oakeshott's magnum opus. One of the many virtues of O'Sullivan's essay is that it avoids the obscurity of the book. But it is far more than merely exegetical. It considers the main criticisms of Oakeshott's argument and shows that they either rest on misunderstanding, or are easily countered by a deeper understanding of the argument. O'Sullivan then states and considers what he takes to be the most serious problems with Oakeshott's argument. Chief among them is Oakeshott's realization, reached during the years before his death, that the likelihood is virtually non-existent that the political arrangements he has favored would be approximated in the conditions that prevail in the Western world. O'Sullivan movingly describes the disappointment and sadness to which this realization had led Oakeshott and would lead those who share his political outlook. The emerging view is not tragic, but an elegiac lament for what might have been but will not be.

Noel Malcolm is the best contemporary interpreter of Hobbes. His edition of Hobbes' collected works is a monument of scholarship. Oakeshott, of course, was centrally concerned with Hobbes and was much influenced by what he took to be Hobbes' political view. Malcolm's remarkable contribution is twofold. First, it shows that at the center of Oakeshott's political thought there is at least a tension, but more likely an inconsistency, between Oakeshott's well-known criticism of rationalism in politics and Hobbes' political thought. This is because Hobbes rightly understood is a rationalist in just the sense Oakeshott deplored. Second, it shows that Oakeshott's view that had endured throughout his life, namely the non-instrumentality of the state, is incompatible with Hobbes' view that the state is instrumental to the maintenance of peace. Malcolm's discussion deepens our understanding of Oakeshott's political ideas and raises fundamental questions about them.

Corey Abel concentrates on Oakeshott's work on aesthetics. Oakeshott had pronounced views on this subject, but it is not clear what they were. Most of them were expressed in "The Voice of Poetry in the Conversation of Mankind", but it is hard to say what he means by poetry, what it includes and excludes, and consequently how far his views about poetry in particular can be extended to aesthetics in general. Abel helpfully reconstructs Oakeshott's view, while raising critical questions about it.

Paul Franco writes about Oakeshott's view of education. As one of the volume's editors, Franco does what all the contributors should have done, but several failed to do, which is not just to explain but also to assess Oakeshott's view on a particular aspect of his thought. The aim of the volume is not mere exegesis, but also critical appraisal, which includes examining reasons for and against Oakeshott's philosophical views on particular subjects. Franco carefully and perspicuously describes the context of debates in England in the 1940s and 50s about what university education should be. These debates formed the background and the target of Oakeshott's writings about university education. Franco then criticizes Oakeshott's views for combining more than a little polemical rhetoric and the defense of a worthy ideal that was becoming impractical in an age in which university education was no longer the privilege of the few. Much has been lost thereby, and we are now living with the consequences of it.

Kenneth Minogue is concerned with Oakeshott's developing views of rationalism. In "Rationalism in Politics", Oakeshott, of course, condemned it. In The Politics of Faith and the Politics of Scepticism, written shortly after "Rationalism in Politics", but published only posthumously, he has a more subtle view. In that book, he sees the history of political thought and politics itself veering between the two extremes of faith and skepticism. As Oakeshott sees it, and Minogue reconstructs, the key is to balance the claims of faith and skepticism in the prevailing political arrangements. It is an interesting question, which I have no space to consider, whether Minogue's interpretation could resolve the inconsistency that Malcolm diagnoses in Oakeshott's thoughts. Be that as it may, Minogue concludes his contribution by lamenting the fact, rightly so in my opinion, that contemporary politics has veered much too closely toward the politics of faith in the form of egalitarian liberalism.

Geoffrey Thomas discusses Oakeshott's view of history. His view is obscure and often appears to be absurd, as, for instance, in claiming that the past does not exist and history is what historians make it. Thomas very helpfully explains what Oakeshott had in mind by these needlessly paradoxical claims and then goes on to assess them critically. Anyone puzzled by Oakeshott's view of history should read this contribution.

The last of the excellent essays is Martyn Thompson's on the history of political thought. His is not just an attempt to understand Oakeshott's approach to a view central to Oakeshott's concern, but a genuine contribution to this controversial subject. Thompson claims that Oakeshott's view was that the classic works in the history of political thought in general, and Hobbes' in particular, have a dual aspect: one is practical, the other is the formulation of a political philosophy. Understanding classic works requires understanding both aspects, and neglecting neither. Thompson discusses the reciprocal criticisms of Skinner and Oakeshott of their different approaches, and thereby manages to illuminate both.

Turning now to the contributions I find mediocre, I must explain first why I find them wanting. Each is a reliable exegetical account of Oakeshott's views on a particular aspect of his work, but none of them contains a critical assessment of his philosophical contribution. Since such an assessment is part of the announced aim of this volume, the editors should have required contributors to go beyond exegesis, no matter how reliable it is, and probe the reasons for and against the views of Oakeshott they are discussing. The four essays that are wanting in this way are as follows. David Boucher shows that Oakeshott has remained an idealist throughout his published works. Kenneth MacIntyre explains Oakeshott's view of philosophy as presented in Experience and Its Modes, "The Voice of Poetry in the Conversation of Mankind", and in On Human Conduct. Elizabeth Corey describes Oakeshott's view of religion and Steven Gerencher does the same for Oakeshott's view of law. It seems to me that anyone interested in understanding Oakeshott's views on these subjects should read Oakeshott rather than a second-hand exegesis of what he wrote.

I left to the end four essays that I find seriously deficient, although for very different reasons. The first of these is Robert Devigne's on Oakeshott's conservatism. The essay is a rehash of Devigne's twenty-year-old book. Devigne asks whether Oakeshott was a conservative, says yes, but provides an unacceptably superficial explanation of how Oakeshott understood conservatism. Moreover, the essay is as much about Burke and Strauss as it is about Oakeshott, and it does not even begin to recognize that conservatism has different versions, or to consider the reasons for or against Oakeshott's version.

Anyone interested in Oakeshott is indebted to Timothy Fuller for his fine editorial work in assembling and arranging the publication of many of Oakeshott's books. I regret to have to say that I find his contribution to this volume pompous and dogmatic. Fuller writes as if he were Oakeshott's St. Paul, having privileged access to the truth given to him from above, a truth he now condescends to share with lesser folk, although without supporting it with reasons. The supposed truth is what Fuller calls the radical temporality of the human condition. He means by this pretentious phrase that time passes and things change. This, he says, leads to "the terrors of the radical temporality of the human condition" (133). Fuller can believe whatever he likes, but he is not entitled to interpret Oakeshott's view of the human condition on the basis of a few episodic asides in his writings, ignore much of what he explicitly wrote contrary to it, and read Oakeshott as if he were Heidegger.

Oakeshott loved and enjoyed life and was not terrorized by it. In Rationalism in Politics, the second edition of which Fuller has edited, Oakeshott wrote that life involves "the enjoyment of an inheritance" (2); that "the greater part of what we have is not a burden to be carried or an incubus to be thrown off, but an inheritance to be enjoyed" (45); and that his purpose "is not to define a word, but to detect the secret of what we enjoy, to recognize what is hostile to it, and to discern how it may be enjoyed more fully" (387). Nearing the end of his life, in On Human Conduct he wrote that "the gift of a religious faith is that of reconciliation to the unavoidable dissonances of the human condition . . . a mode of acceptance, a 'graceful' response" (81) and he understands the human condition "as an adventure in personal self-enactment . . . and a recognition that 'it is something divine for a man to know how to belong to himself' and live by that understanding" (241). The quote within this passage is from his beloved Montaigne. Fuller may pontificate about what he takes to be terror, but he should not ascribe it to Oakeshott, and he should at least attempt to give reasons for and examine reasons against it.

The third deficient essay is by Leslie Marsh, one of the editors of this volume. He compares Oakeshott and Hayek from the point of view of cognitive science. I find this more than a little odd. Oakeshott and Hayek were strongly opposed to a scientific approach to understanding human beings. Cognitive science is the most recent approach of this kind. To try to understand either Oakeshott's or Hayek's work through it is absurd. There is no reason for inserting a discussion of Hayek and cognitive science in the assessment of Oakeshott's philosophical contribution.

In closing I must -- reluctantly -- say something about Robert Grant's contribution. It has no place in this volume. It is about Oakeshott's sex life. There is no discussion in it of Oakeshott's work. It consists in peddling often malicious hearsay from largely uncheckable sources. Oakeshott was very careful to separate his private life from his work. This should be respected, but Grant tramples on it. The editors have made a serious misjudgment in including this essay.

The book is handsomely produced, easily readable, and having a good reproduction of Bruegel's The Tower of Babel on the dust jacket was an inspired choice.