A Companion to Rawls

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John Mandle and David A. Reidy (eds.), A Companion to Rawls, Wiley Blackwell, 2014, 587pp., $199.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781444337105.

Reviewed by Catherine Audard, London School of Economics and Political Science


This extremely impressive book has been recently complemented by the editors' equally impressive Rawls Lexicon (Cambridge, 2015). Both publications place Jon Mandle and David A. Reidy on the map of Rawlsian scholarship in a lead position, the more so if we take into account their own numerous publications in the field. Still, the question may be asked, do we really need another collection of essays on Rawls? We have now no fewer than ten major collections, starting with Norman Daniels's Reading Rawls (Basic Books, 1975), still one of the most useful anthologies, continuing with the five volumes of Henry Richardson and Paul Weithman's The Philosophy of Rawls (New York, Garland 1999), and culminating with Samuel Freeman's Cambridge Companion to Rawls (Cambridge, 2003), not to mention such more specialized collections as Rex Martin's Rawls's Law of Peoples (Blackwell, 2006), Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson's Property-Owning Democracy (Blackwell, 2014) and Ruth Abbey's Feminist Interpretations of Rawls (Penn State University Press, 2013). How does this new volume compare? What does it bring that Rawls scholars, beginning or more advanced, would need or enjoy? And, more generally, why is Rawls's work still generating such intense interest more than forty years after A Theory of Justice was published and nearly fifteen years after his death?

We may start with the second question to shed light on this book's purpose. The ongoing interest in Rawls and the recent surge in Rawlsian scholarship can be linked to one central feature of his thought and method. What is distinctive about Rawls's endeavor is his will to give theoretical structure and systematicity to the critique of political power and institutions in the name of justice. This is why we need a theory of justice. Rawls was not motivated by a dream of theoretical purity, immune from the complexities of history and politics. He was inspired by the democratic principle of legitimacy: citizens, not God or some superior Legislator, produce the political norms by which they abide. Mandle and Reidy quite rightly quote Rawls's answer to Habermas: "In justice as fairness, there are no philosophical experts. Heaven forbid!" (Political Liberalism [PL], p. 427). The best way to respect democracy's main values (citizens' autonomy and fairness to all concerned) is to embody them in a fair practice of justification that treats them as free sources of authentication. The justification process itself has to be fair, hence the expression 'justice as fairness', meaning that justice is not a formal treatment of persons but takes into account and recognizes their specific situations and higher interests. The democratic impulse is key to Rawls's conception of political philosophy, which, in the democratic age, is both modest and empowering. Only participants in the justification process can give validity to the superiority of some substantive norms over others; in effect, Rawls is appealing to universal suffrage to define the just as that which is publicly agreed upon by citizens.

However, in a democratic context, there is no obvious agreement on what this requires. Moreover, this may lead to the familiar problems of consensus and demagogy inherent in majority rule. What if all citizens prefer a situation where minorities are discriminated against? What if they all prefer injustice to justice? Are we not bound to ask again for an independent criterion to escape such dreadful results? The genius of Rawls is to have remained faithful against the odds to this conception of political philosophy as essentially democratic self-understanding in spite of its obvious difficulties and challenges and to have forged a new idiom for it, a new method, the famous device of the Original Position, that seeks to include democratic representation in the legitimating process itself. This democratic self-understanding necessarily remains a "work in progress", as it necessitates further debates and explanations. The topics include: communitarians v. liberals; welfare-state capitalism and the difference principle; the nature of comprehensive liberalism v. political liberalism; and the meaning of ideal v. non-ideal theory. Invitations to debates and diverging interpretations seem to be built into the theory itself. As a consequence, most readers of Rawls want to participate and add their contribution because he is simply reconstructing ideas that are familiar, albeit puzzling on reflection. One shouldn't be amazed by the huge secondary literature his work has generated on a scale unparalleled even by more important philosophers. One reason is that his style and his democratic impulse, his paramount concern for public justification and not simply his ideas, are responsible for generating such an outcome. His work has created a huge community of discussion among philosophers, economists, sociologists, politicians, technocrats, and even the wider public, as if every citizen had some comment to make and some contribution to add to the whole endeavor. Both Rawls's work and the scale of secondary literature that it has generated is certainly unique.

Now, what is distinctive about this new book? First, it has the obvious advantage of giving access to the most recent publications and material that shed new light on Rawls's development and on his relation to the history of moral and political philosophy, to Kant in particular. Reidy's opening essay on Rawls's undergraduate thesis and papers from 1946 and 1950 is of capital importance. It shows the roots of Rawls's coherentist conception of truth and of "reflective equilibrium" as originating in his view of practical reason as independently positing its own norms. "Practical reason is the final arbiter of its own authority" (p. 22). In that sense, Rawls was Kantian even before he started being interested in Kant. Remember how Rawls follows Kant's definition of practical reason as "being concerned with the production of objects according to a conception of those objects . . . while theoretical reason is concerned with the knowledge of given objects" (PL, p. 93). The productive capacity of the mind is a philosophical presupposition of Rawls's whole methodology and of his search for "doctrinal autonomy" (PL, p. 98).

Reidy also clarifies Rawls's progression from ethical theory to moral philosophy and to democratic theory while he was staying in Oxford in 1952-1953. From an early stage Rawls was convinced that moral philosophy should contribute to democratic theory, which, as seen by the young Rawls at the time, was plagued by two moral outlooks that undermine liberal democracies: positivism that denies the authority of practical reason and treats citizens as subjected to causes rather than to reasons, and authoritarian views that "assert ethical principles must be taken on authority" (p. 25). This explains Rawls's endeavor to contribute to "an alternative non-positivist, non-authoritarian yet fully cognitive view of morality, one more congenial to a genuinely viable democratic politics" (p. 25). Very useful and enlightening in that respect is Larry Krasnoff's comparison between Kant's and Rawls's constructivisms, leading to the conclusion that "the controversial aspect of Kant's practical philosophy is not the value it gives to autonomy, but the way he understands that value as not theoretically perceived, but practically construed" (p. 83). Similarly, "we can say that the political autonomy of Rawlsian citizens is itself practically constructed" (p. 84) and that Kantian constructivism is not a view that Rawls should have rejected in order to facilitate a more effective political consensus. It is central to his conception of justification that the roles of theoretical and practical reason should be clearly delineated and that the ultimate authority should remain the autonomous will of free and equal citizens.

In "Political Constructivism" Aaron James argues in favour of a deep critical commitment to Kant that runs from A Theory of Justice to PL and of a sense of continuity in Rawls's thinking that has been underestimated. Kantian themes have helped Rawls "characterize how his own rationalism stands independent from those very Kantian ideas" and "his later 'political turn' does not amount to a major break from his earlier generally Kantian approach" (p. 262). Paul Guyer, one of the great Kant scholars of our time, argues in his very important and stimulating paper that both Kant and Rawls share " a subtle relation between deontological and teleological considerations" (p. 547), meaning that the stark contrast between deontology and teleology that all students of Rawls would immediately recognize should be revised and questioned. For instance,

Kant's foundation of the categorical imperative upon the value of freedom as the inner worth of the world has the same structure as Rawls's Kantian Interpretation of justice as fairness, although Kant was much more ambivalent than was Rawls about grounding his teleology on a straightforward, empirically evidenced desire to express our freedom as free and equal beings (p. 562).

Another rich vein of contributions concerns the applications of justice as fairness to social policy. This fits with an increasing interest in Rawls's critique of capitalism, in particular, for the social and economic institutions of a property-owning democracy that he advocates and for answers to increasingly unsustainable levels of inequality within democratic societies and among peoples. Three main criticisms in that domain have exercised Rawls's readers recently.

First, questions concerning the possibility of applying the theory to 'real-world' problems such as inequality and the extent of its utopian nature, of its moralistic (Bernard Williams, In the Beginning was the Deed, 2005) and non-realistic "transcendental" orientation (Amartya Sen, The Idea of Justice, 2009) have come to the fore of current debates. Zofia Stemplowska and Adam Swift ("Rawls on Ideal and Nonideal Theory") offer an excellent summary of these criticisms. In particular, they present an answer to both Williams's and Sen's criticisms, arguing that a crucial distinction the two fail to make should be drawn between "ideal theory" and a "theory of ideals". "Much of what Rawls does consists in a theory of ideals -- an attempt to list and prioritize the values of liberal democracy"; here "particular forms of idealization are extremely useful in helping us to disentangle, clarify, and sometimes to weigh the competing values that can be applied to the feasible set" (p. 125). This would help us figure out how the principles of justice can be translated into principles to guide the actions of individuals in charge of social policy.

The second debate concerns Rawls's commitment to social justice. For many critics, applying the theory to increasingly unsustainable levels of inequality within democratic societies has proved more difficult than at first thought. Rawls himself recognizes that the Difference Principle, which recommends that inequalities are justified if they are proved to advance the situation of the least favored, is a principle that would not fall under constitutional essentials as it "is more demanding and not so regarded" (Justice as Fairness, p. 48). For many critics, Rawls seems to have abandoned the social ideal of equality and fraternity that defines the Difference Principle. On the other hand, the principle is not radical enough versus the status quo as it relies too heavily on financial incentives in the absence of which selfish and successful maximizers would refuse to work more for the good of all, the least favored especially. This has been the subject of intense scrutiny, especially by G.A. Cohen (Rescuing Justice and Equality, 2008). It is, therefore, impressive to see how many essays in the collection argue that Rawls was much more radical than at first thought and that his relation to capitalism was a very complex one. In particular, Colin M. Mcleod develops Rawls's view of a property-owning democracy and shows why this has recently attracted a lot of interest. He claims that "far from providing a sophisticated ideological apology for the liberal welfare state, Rawls's first principle of justice actually provides a damning indictment of many features of contemporary liberal democracies" (p. 172). Freeman agrees when he writes

it is a serious misreading then to suppose that the difference principle and the institutional division of labor are intended to accommodate capitalism. Rawls explicitly argues that capitalism, even welfare-state capitalism is unjust, since it concentrates economic powers, including control over productive wealth, in the hands of a capitalist class (p. 104-105).

Daniel Brudney's "The Young Marx and the Middle-Aged Rawls" and Daniel Little's very informative "Rawls and Economics" contribute to a new vision of Rawls as a critic of welfare-state capitalism and a defender of a much more generous social liberalism, dedicated to the struggle against unjust inequalities that thwart the potential for human self-development.

The third main debate, concerning the difficulty of applying the theory to global injustices, has generated a huge body of work, which is extensively discussed in Part V. On the whole, the consensus has been a general condemnation of Rawls's Law of Peoples as an insufficient defense of human rights and global justice. Because of his strict distinction between "peoples" as the subjects of global justice and individuals as the subjects of domestic justice, there is no space in Rawls for a robust protection of individuals' rights whenever and wherever they are threatened. This is seen as the responsibility of autonomous "peoples" that may have different non-liberal but decent views of the individual and her rights rather than the responsibility of international institutions. Rawls's distinction has been widely rejected by cosmopolitans in the name of our common humanity, whatever the cultural differences. Among a great number of papers defending or critiquing Rawls, Huw Lloyd Williams offers a nuanced defense of his opposition to cosmopolitanism and Gillian Brock gives a convincing explanation of some of the limits Rawls wants to impose on a list of basic human rights as acted upon in international relations. In the field of economic justice, Rawls disappointingly limits it to a duty of assistance with a cut-off point in time, again, in order to respect the autonomy of peoples. Richard W. Miller wonders whether Rawls's conception of peoples as autonomous entities does not show that "the emphasis on fundamental interests in self-reliance and association, makes the Rawlsian picture of justice look more like the libertarian picture than most suppose" (p. 374).

One last aspect of this collection, among many others worth underlining, is its contribution to the understanding of Rawls as a quasi-Rousseauist republican, or, at least, a republican liberal as he appears both in his debate with Habermas (presented in Kenneth Baynes's paper) and in PL. A number of the contributions in Part IV stress the importance that Rawls attaches to political liberties and political participation in the first principle of justice and to the political conception of the person as citizen in his "political turn". In particular, Richard Dagger's paper on Rawls's conception of civic virtue shows that "civic virtue is intimately connected to Rawls's fundamental idea of political society as a fair system of cooperation" (p. 299). However, Dagger lists a number of criticisms and concludes that Rawls's distinction between political and comprehensive liberalisms is not as sharp as he assumes and that his view of citizens' allegiance to public reason and democratic institutions lacks consideration of such values as patriotism, nationalism, or solidarity. It remains too cerebral and "bloodless" to constitute a full-blown conception of civic virtue (p. 308). In a more Kantian approach, Robert S. Taylor offers a reconstruction of Rawls's arguments for the special status of political liberties in quasi-republican terms: not as "instrumentally valuable in the defense of the other basic liberties", as in classical liberalism, but "as participation in republican self-government . . . political liberty is not simply a means to the development and utilization of our capacity for moral autonomy, but also in some sense is that capacity" (p.159). One should however balance that line of interpretation of Rawls as a republican with Barbara H. Fried's stimulating paper showing Rawls leaning towards libertarianism in his "unwritten" theory of justice (p.432).

After this brief survey, which cannot do full justice to such a rich and diverse collection, one last question must be answered. Who should its readership be? This is perhaps where the project may be found lacking. It is obvious that it is aimed at the advanced Rawlsian scholar, not the beginner, as it implies knowledge of the basic ideas and texts and of a good share of the current secondary literature. However, the collection is somehow misleading in that some papers have included a summary of the "basics", some not, so the reader might be slightly disoriented. One must also note that the level of scholarship is sometimes uneven, with some very philosophical essays, others by contrast remaining too descriptive.

Among the other shortcomings is possibly a lack of contributions on Rawls's view of history, which makes Part VI on Conversations with Other Perspectives weaker than it should have been. Rawls had a deep sense of the historical contextuality of his conception and even if he does not emphasize it enough, it is a major point to be clarified against both abstract universalism on the one hand and historicism and relativism on the other. Such clarification would have given Part VI more unity of purpose and cohesion, whereas it seems a bit like a catch-all section, albeit a rich and interesting one. Possibly, the choice that the editors made to concentrate on concepts rather than debates makes the collection appear more disjointed than it should have been. The success of their remarkable Rawls Lexicon, which works extremely well on that basis, may have inspired them to extend their methodology to this collection where it is probably less convincing.

Anyway, these are minor criticisms, and this splendid collection is well worth exploring as it addresses many more questions than all the past anthologies, making a first-class contribution to the comprehensive understanding of Rawls's work and to political philosophy in general.