A Companion to Relativism

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Steven D. Hales (ed.), A Companion to Relativism, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 662pp., $199.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405190213.

Reviewed by Elijah Millgram, University of Utah


The economic imperatives of the publishing industry are producing a spate of reference anthologies focused on fairly narrow topics, in this case relativism. Meant to be sold to libraries rather than individuals, they consist of a large number of commissioned essays (here 31 of them), which cover as many aspects as possible of the topic in question; with occasional exceptions, the essays are surveys rather than new material. While very few people will read such books from cover to cover, they nonetheless provide occasions for assessing a state of play. I'm going to take the opportunity to think about how discussion of relativism is proceeding within analytic philosophy, and where it ought to go next.

The cross section of the debate shows it to include two primary enterprises; although they overlap, they are distinguished by their centers of gravity. One of them is in the business of producing semantic theories of high-traffic and structurally important linguistic devices. For instance, epistemic modals (that is, locutions like "He might be home by now") are reconstructed (controversially, to be sure) as taking truth values that vary with who is assessing them. Philosophers may want to keep track of the struggle underway here to give the terms "contextualism" and "relativism" distinct uses; a terminological consensus, involving new conventions as to what counts as the content of a proposition, is starting to crystallize, and may affect other subspecializations within the field. A secondary focus of this enterprise is ongoing intellectual practices such as mathematics, in which practitioners have the freedom to explore systems of axioms, inference rules and so on of their own choosing.

I have to be a little more roundabout in characterizing the other and more traditional enterprise. The various authors' discussions are shaped by a short list of ur-scenes; by calling them that, I mean in part that they are drawn from something like a shared philosophical imagination, and are not particularly anchored by the concrete details or texture of actual situations. One of them is populated by faraway people who have alien and often repugnant views or practices when it comes to cosmology, how the day-to-day world works, religion, ethics, gender roles and much else. Another is peopled by pretty much those same cultures and ethnicities, now no longer so far away; in this second ur-scene, you have to share a political state with them, and you are brought up short by, perhaps, their furious response to what they insist is your blasphemy. Another is a landscape of scientific communities that talk past each other because they have been trained on different Kuhnian paradigms. And there are scenes of disagreement within our own community, characteristically those in which convergence is not enforced: sports fans arguing over the merits of their respective teams, or consumers who identify with their own (and disparage one another's) brand preferences. Throughout the contributions covering this side of the discussion, the philosophical exercise is assumed to consist in coming up with an internally coherent way of talking about such circumstances, one that allows that each of the parties within them may be right in their own way -- or (the minority option) to demonstrate that it cannot be done.

The various accounts help themselves to two shared features of these ur-scenes. The first is not so much faultless disagreement (a recent catchphrase) as fruitlessdisagreement, in the first place because the standards used to adjudicate what is at issue are not shared. No matter how long we let the argument between the fans of the respective teams run, we do not expect either to persuade the other. The scientists' paradigms are incommensurable; neither group will count the other's arguments as compelling, or even necessarily as arguments at all. The religious or ethnic community with whom your community leaders have to negotiate censorship policies is not going to be convinced that you are right and they are wrong, not ever. (Akeel Bilgrami discusses a more nuanced variant: maybe eventually, but not anytime soon.) Those people in faraway lands can perhaps be vanquished, but not made to see the errors of their heathen ways. You can argue, but you're wasting your time -- unless the point just is to pass time over beers, or, as Pierre Bourdieau famously suggested in his Distinction (Harvard University Press, 1984), social positioning.

The second shared feature of these ur-scenes is that it doesn't really matter if the participants come to an agreement: to one or another extent (there's some variation along this dimension from scene to scene), you can ignore what those other people think. Philosophers who write about natives in faraway places seem to imagine themselves as tourists (or, sometimes, as hosting tourists); in the end, you (or they) return safely home; you display your souvenirs, are bemused or disturbed by what you saw and the people you talked to, but don't have to adopt their marriage customs for your own. When the political state is shared by ethnic and religious communities that are scarcely on speaking terms, what is at issue in these treatments is (although philosophers will be polite) how you will put up with the other community, and putting up with them means finding ways of bracketing rather than resolving conflicts of opinion. Leaving ongoing scientific revolutions to one side for a moment, the alternative scientific paradigms in these discussions are buried in the more or less distant past; the question raised by the different evidential standards of Aristotelian or Newtonian physics is not whether you should convert to one of the defunct paradigms yourself. And finally, nothing hangs on whether you can agree about which team deserves to win the World Series, or which microbrew caters to the more sophisticated palate.

Although the enterprises treat very different substantive domains, they share motivations and a methodology, and before proceeding to the methodology, I'll mention one of the motivations, just to clear it out of the way. In the Theaetetus, Plato's Socrates argued that Protagoras' relativism was self-refuting, and philosophers ever since have been raised to think that they can dismiss relativism with a quip: "Is relativism true? Or is it just true for you?" (Harvey Siegel's essay presents a nuanced and contemporary version of this train of thought, and is recommended.) Although in general to represent a position is not to have given an argument for it, here we have an exception: to find an internally consistent way of talking through relativism is to respond to the old objection, by showing that relativism can be a consistent view. The last decade has seen a number of ambitious formal treatments of relativism (discussed but not rehearsed in this volume) which evidently have this point, and the authors seem to be unaware of a somewhat earlier such attempt, in the first chapter of Robert Nozick's Invariances (Harvard University Press, 2001). I remarked above that the two enterprises in our snapshot overlap, and those formal treatments make up a large part of the shared territory.

However, I am for my own part uncertain that this reason for working up accounts of one or another form of relativism merits the effort that has been put into it. Socrates' argument turned on an additional and very ambitious claim imputed to Protagoras: that you can't ever be wrong about anything. But while that claim is apparently what sometimes attracts sophomores to their relativisms, it is not a consequence of relativism generally. Just for instance, even if science is paradigm-relative, most work by scientists is of indifferent quality, and much of it is flat out wrong; what counts as good style is very plausibly relative to a literary tradition, but most writers, regardless of what tradition they're brought up in, can scarcely manage decently written prose by that tradition's own lights. The ambitious claim was an optional add-on, and so we don't really need a formal theory of the subject matter, or even an informal theory, just to show that relativism need not contradict itself.

Both enterprises share a familiar methodology, one which normally goes unremarked. We approach a philosophical problem by eliciting a pattern of judgments (for instance, reactions to ur-scenes of the sort I was describing earlier, or to the use, in a given circumstance, of a sentence containing an epistemic modal), and we construct an account of the intellectual machinery that generates those judgments in the form of a semantic theory -- that is, a theory of what sentences that invoke the machinery mean. The technique used to be called "conceptual analysis," but the semantic elements whose contours are being traced are not always concepts, and that is especially true in this subject area.

When we reconstruct the performance profile of an intellectual device, we can expect the value of our results to vary with its usage. On the one hand, if the device shows up frequently in ordinary conversation, if it is normally used to convey information that must subsequently be acted on, if ensuing mistakes can be straightforwardly identified and corrected, usually on the spot or shortly thereafter, and if the device has been part of our intellectual repertoire for a sufficiently long time, then you are reconstructing the workings of something that works. Epistemic modals satisfy these requirements.  Presumably because they have had literally centuries of debugging and field testing, we can rely on them to do their job, and when a philosopher of language tries to figure out what that job is, and just how it is performed, we can expect him to be finding out something of import. (However, you don't want to leap to conclusions about what you're finding out; as Patrick Rysiew insightfully points out, you wouldn't take a theory of the indexicals "here" and "now" to be a theory of spacetime; don't decide too quickly that a theory of epistemic modals is a theory of knowledge, or part of one.) Or again, mathematics works; so if you produce a theory of mathematical practice, and it has the form of a relativism, you have at any rate produced a relativist theory of something that works, and we can expect this to be a result of philosophical value.

If, on the other hand, the device is not systematically exercised in day-to-day use, if it is not required to convey information on which you can act, if misuse is not monitored and corrected, or if it simply is of recent provenence and does not have much of a track record, then we should not assume that a linguistic or semantic theory of sentences that embed the device will tell us anything we particularly need to know. (As the computer scientists put it: garbage in, garbage out.) But now recall the materials that second enterprise we were looking at works with: ways of talking about fruitless disagreement; ways of talking about people you don't have to live with; ways of talking about people you have to put up with, but with whom you will have as little to do as possible; in short, ways of talking about people that (to a greater or lesser extent) you can afford to ignore. When you use relativistic locutions in such circumstances, it does not matter that you get them right, moment to moment, in anything like the way that it matters that you get your epistemic modals right. No one is likely to correct you, no one is likely to act on what you have told them, and in any case, most of these locutions are historically recent, and have far too short a track record to be relied on for anything that matters. A philosophical theory that holds itself responsible to judgments about the sort of ur-scenes we were considering is a reconstruction of the ways some people happen to think and talk about subject areas in which there is no penalty for being full of hot air. Such a theory is very unlikely to be telling us about intellectual equipment that does real work.

There is a deeper problem here than the fact that we are getting conceptual analyses of something that is not worth analyzing. (Even if it isn't, the analyses are surely a harmless pastime.) In the not-too-distant past, you really could get away with ignoring the views of people who thought differently from you and yours: after all, they were off in faraway lands, which were hard to get to, or on the other side of a ghetto wall, or your disagreement could be dismissed as a mere matter of taste. But times have changed: in the last few hundred years, and especially in the last century, we have become a society of specialists. Induction into one of the many specializations can take up to a decade; it characteristically involves learning a discipline-specific system of representations, internalizing standards for assessing the activities and views of one's fellow specialists, and adopting proprietary modes of argumentation. Because the specialists' standards are not shared, their views and practices exhibit the features that prompt relativist theorizing; when historians, philosophers and literature professors disagree as to, say, what the right reading of Hume is, and no amount of argument will bring them around, a natural fallback is that each of the readings may be correct -- for that discipline. When an outsider is aware of another discipline's internal standards, he may well and is even likely to think they are wrongheaded. (Not sure what I mean? Try explaining a transcendental argument to a developmental psychologist or a chemist.) The variations in sensibility across the natural sciences -- especially and in particular with respect to what can count as a good argument -- are both commonplace and awkward enough to have given rise to a genre of joke. ("How do a mathematician, a physicist and an engineer" -- and here's one typical continuation -- "prove that all odd numbers are prime?") Disciplinary specialization as we now have it is relativism come home.

There is this difference between the relativism of disciplinary specializations and the older relativisms represented by our list of ur-scenes. We do not just have to live with people who think differently from us, we have to depend on them, and, in particular, believe them: pretty much every specialist relies on the expertise of specialists in other fields. We cannot ignore those who think differently from ourselves because we are now, whether we like it or not, their epistemic clients. The issues raised by relativism intersect those discussed in the testimony and peer disagreement literatures; the snapshot this anthology provides shows us that unfortunately there is practically no back and forth between the philosophers working on these topics.

If the society in which we live shares the structural features of the ur-scenes -- especially, the clashes between standards of assessment -- that prompt philosophical discussion of relativism, but does so with the important difference just described, that should set a philosophical agenda. For most of us, the real question to which the circumstances of relativism give rise is: when and why should we accept the expert pronouncements of specialists which are arrived at on the basis of procedures and in conformity with standards that either (i) we do not understand, or (ii) which conflict with the standards and procedures that we ourselves endorse? If the way physicists solve problems looks to an engineer like a joke, and vice versa, why are the both of them willing to use each other's solutions as premises in their own arguments? That willingness is of course modulated; sometimes a specialist (or a layperson) will accept expert pronouncements produced to standards that he does not endorse, and sometimes not; what makes the difference, and why? The philosophical treatments that we need of relativism-come-home will not be about offering people a way of talking about other people they are going to ignore as much as they can, but rather attempts to make sense of how we adopt beliefs and allow our decisions to be guided by people whom we cannot afford to ignore, but whose theoretical and practical standards differ from and even conflict with our own.

A few moments back, I put to one side the problems of a scientific-revolution-in-progress, but here we can see what is very much the same problem. What a philosophical treatment of incommensurable paradigms owes us is not, in the first place, an account of irresolvable disagreement, but of the ways that scientists are able to rely on results arrived at by previous scientists working in now-discredited paradigms. The interest in the rational reconstruction of scientific theories was no doubt motivated in part by the hope of bypassing this difficulty, but those projects have not succeeded, at any rate not as of yet. (Igor Douven's essay covers the endeavors of philosophers who are still in the rational reconstruction business.) Accordingly, any actual scientist working in a field with a sufficiently deep history relies indirectly on work by his predecessors that was done to standards which he rejects. For instance, if general relativity is accepted because -- I'll stick with the Kuhnian way of talking -- it resolves anomalies within Newtonian physics, and those anomalies are sharpened up to the point where they motivate a shift to a new paradigm by results produced within the old Newtonian paradigm, then contemporary physicists are deferring to results produced within the rejected paradigm.

If these observations are accurate, then work on relativism that confines itself to the old list of ur-scenes should at second glance seem disconcertingly off-base, and so it does. Here is an illustration from the present volume. Now, the Companion's most apparent shortcoming is the lack of any extended discussion of Bernard Williams's subtle and influential investigation of relativism, one which occupied him throughout his career. But his mature position is nonetheless represented by Carol Rovane's admirably clear essay; she advances views that, as far as I can tell, agree with Williams throughout. (Rovane does not take herself to be explaining Williams, so a straight-on discussion of Williams is still missing, as are Williams's own second thoughts, worked out in his Shame and Necessity [University of California Press, 1993] through the extensive exploration of an historical case study.) The Williams-Rovane conclusion (to which he gave the label "relativism of distance") is that the relativism-inducing perspectives must be inferentially and logically segregated from one another: from the truth of p in another perspective, nothing follows within one's own perspective. Williams and Rovane are, it seems to me, correct about what is built into our present ways of thinking and speaking. But the problem posed by disciplinary relativism-come-home is how to use the pronouncements emitted by the alien perspectives in one's own reasoning: which is precisely what it is for the perspectives not to be inferentially segregated.

A second illustration, this time from the other enterprise: although it's worth figuring out how the high-traffic linguistic devices we have work, we don't see efforts focused on solving the problem we've identified. Sticking with the example of epistemic modals, if, for all an intuitionist mathematician knows, p (if, he tells us, p might be true), what should we, who aren't intuitionists ourselves, think about p? What if we're laypersons, who don't even know what intuitionism is? The question we most need addressed is not what epistemic modals mean, but what to do with other people's.

Our present ways of thinking are what is reconstructed by conceptual analysis, and it appears that they do not equip us to handle the urgent practical demands faced by a society of experts and specialists. Consequently, the solution to the philosophical problems posed by recent technological and economic development will not be provided by conceptual analysis: a methodological shift of key will be needed, to inventing new solutions to new problems, as opposed to retelling and clarifying the old solutions our ancestors devised to older problems long ago. As we turn our attention to designing the novel intellectual equipment we require, it is a good thing to have on hand an overview of where we are setting out from. And for that, the Companion to Relativism is just fine. Although some of the essays are better than others, the overall level of professional competence is high, the writing is clear, coverage of the topic is fair and (modulo the missing uptake of Nozick and Williams) it is thorough. Just because it is so thorough, gaps in the discussion stand out vividly, and we have seen how helpful that can be.[1]

[1] Thanks to Chrisoula Andreou and Ben Crowe for comments on an earlier draft.