A Companion to Socrates

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Sara Ahbel-Rappe and Rachana Kamtekar (eds.), A Companion to Socrates, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 552pp., $149.95 (hbk), ISBN 1450108630.

Reviewed by C.C.W. Taylor, Corpus Christi College, Oxford


The size and scope of this volume invite comparison with another recent comprehensive collection of articles on Socrates, Vassilis Karasmanis' Socrates, 2400 Years Since his Death, published by the European Cultural Centre of Delphi in 2004, and containing the proceedings of an international conference held at Athens and Delphi in 2001. The authorship of that volume is drawn from many countries in Europe and North America, and its arrangement is primarily thematic and dialectical, many contributions consisting of comments on other papers. The present volume, by contrast, is overwhelmingly North American; of its thirty contributors only three (one each from Australia, Israel and the U.K.) are not affiliated to North American institutions (twenty-six in the U.S. and one in Canada).

The papers are all independent of one another, though some themes are discussed in more than one paper; thus three papers (by Richard Janko, A.A. Long and John Bussanich) deal with different aspects of the place of religion in Socrates' life, two (by Christopher Rowe and the late Heda Segvic) with the theme of Socratic intellectualism and two (by Roslyn Weiss and Harold Tarrant) with aspects of Socratic elenchus. Whereas Karasmanis' volume was almost wholly confined to the treatment of Socrates in antiquity, eleven papers in the present volume are devoted to 'Socrates after Antiquity', four dealing with the pre-modern period, including Medieval Islam, the Italian Renaissance, Enlightenment France and Hegel, and the remainder with the modern period, starting with Kierkegaard and covering a wide variety of topics, including the relation of the Socratic method to psychoanalysis (Jonathan Lear), and traces of Socratic method in contemporary U.S. education, both in elementary schools and in legal education (Avi Mintz). Though some topics, including the elenchus, love, the sophists and the depiction of Socrates in art are discussed in both volumes, only one paper is (virtually) common to the two; James Hankins' 'Socrates in the Italian Renaissance' in the present volume is a somewhat expanded version of his paper 'The figure of Socrates in the Italian Renaissance' in Karasmanis' collection. Oddly enough, that fact is not acknowledged in the present volume (though the author mentions a forthcoming publication of a longer version in a volume edited by Michael Trapp). That apart, all the papers in the volume appear for the first time, with the exception of Paul Muench's 'Kierkegaard's Socratic point of View', which abridges a paper originally published in Kierkegaardiana 2005.

The section on Socrates' Nachleben follows the core of the book, nineteen papers on 'Socrates in Antiquity', divided into three sub-sections 'Biography and Sources', 'Plato' (eight papers each), and 'Hellenistic Philosophy' (three papers). The first of these is a mixed bag. Kenneth Lapatin's 'Picturing Socrates' traces the history of the representation of Socrates in the visual arts from antiquity to modern times; the fluidity of the theme, ranging from the hagiographic to the erotic (including one example of 19th-century pornography) is well-documented and beautifully illustrated (though in black and white only). Strictly speaking, the topic of the paper takes it outside the boundaries of the main section to which it is assigned, but since it does not fit the post-antique section either, that is hardly a criticism. It was too good a paper to omit, and the editors had to fit it in somewhere. The other papers in this sub-section conform more closely to its theme. Those by Debra Nails on the trial and death of Socrates, Paul Woodruff on Socrates and the Sophists and Susan Prince on Socrates, Antisthenes, and the Cynics deal with central themes, well-documented in the literature. The nature of the topics and the constraints of length largely restrict the authors to retelling what is familiar, which they do with accuracy and clarity. Christian Wildberg reviews with great care and good sense the ancient evidence of connections between Socrates and Euripides and the alleged treatment of Socratic themes in some of the latter's works, especially in the characterization of Medea and Phaedra; he reaches the modest, and to my view very plausible, conclusion that the evidence suggests, not direct engagement with specific Socratic doctrines or arguments, but that Socrates was among the influences contributing to the formation of the dramatist's intellectual and artistic outlook. Louis-André Dorion's paper on Xenophon (translated from the French by Stephen Menn) illustrates the general theme of how different authors shape their portrayal of Socrates according to their own particular agenda by detailing clearly and concisely how Xenophon's portrayal diverges from Plato's; a key point is that in a number of areas including friendship and akrasia Xenophon's Socrates gives to self-mastery (enkrateia) the central role which Plato's Socrates gives to wisdom. The two papers in this section on Socratic religion provide interesting complements to one another. Anthony Long focuses on the nature of Socrates' experience of his 'divine sign', arguing that the phenomenology of the sign was that of utterances experienced as emanating from a rational being external to Socrates himself, the rationality being guaranteed on the one hand by Socrates' background belief that the gods were rational beings who cared for mankind and the world generally, and on the other by his inductive assurance that hitherto the commands issued by the sign had been for his good. Richard Janko, on the other hand, devotes his paper 'Socrates the Freethinker' to the religious background of the period, arguing, provocatively but forcefully, that Socrates was seen (perhaps correctly) as maintaining a radically revisionist theology, including monotheism and the identification of God with Mind and Air, of which traces survive in the fragments of Diogenes of Apollonia and in the Derveni papyrus (whose author Janko believes to have been Diagoras of Melos, a notorious 'atheist' associated with Socrates at Clouds 828-30). Recent scholarship has done much to establish that our understanding of Socrates requires serious discussion of his religious attitudes and behaviour; these two papers make substantial contributions to that discussion.

The eight papers in the Plato sub-section are devoted more to themes common to several dialogues than to exegesis of particular dialogues or analysis of individual arguments. John Bussanich complements the papers of Long and Janko with a discussion of those aspects of Socrates' religious behaviour such as dreams, visions, and trances which indicate that Plato saw Socrates as a quasi-shamanistic figure. This stimulating paper should be read in the light of Long's insistence on the continuity of the religious and rational elements in Socrates' thought, since there are one or two small indications that Bussanich is perhaps inclined to exaggerate the uncanny aspect. Thus in describing Socrates as standing motionless in the snow (my emphasis) for 24 hours at Potidaea he presents a picture of someone whose spiritual powers enabled him to suspend normal physical processes; but, extraordinary though the episode certainly was, it took place in summer (Symposium 220d). In his 'Socratic Love' George Rudebusch conjectures that the main reason why Socrates was condemned for corrupting the young was that he was believed to have taught that one ought to love only those who are useful to one, and maintains that that was a fair interpretation, since Socrates says at Euthydemus 285a7 that 'he is willing to let loved ones be destroyed, if only it make them "useful"' (p. 186). While the central thesis is given some (not wholly compelling) support by Xenophon Memorabilia 1.2.53 (cited by Rudebusch), the reference to the Euthydemus certainly betrays misunderstanding. In the passage cited Socrates is responding ironically to the sophists' argument (283c-d) that since Ktesippus wants his beloved Kleinias to become something which he is not, viz. wise, he must want him to cease to be what he is, viz. unwise, i.e. he must want him to cease to be, i.e. he must want him to be destroyed. When Ktesippus responds angrily Socrates tries to lighten the atmosphere by joking (prosepaizon 285a3) that being 'destroyed' in such a way that one becomes better (because wiser) is a way of being destroyed that no-one could object to. Not, surely, a plausible foundation for a capital charge. (The body of the paper contains a valuable analysis of the treatment of love in the Lysis, which is independent of the alleged connection with the charge of corruption.) Among the other excellent papers in this sub-section I was particularly struck by Richard Kraut's judicious re-examination of the Socratic slogan that the unexamined life is not worth living. He argues, surely correctly, that Socrates is not maintaining that those who do not undertake self-examination are so miserable that they might as well be dead, but rather that they are not living the way a human being should live, since they are missing the greatest good available to humans. Every human life, on this view, should be lived on the basis of philosophical criticism of values, whether undertaken by the individual agent, as Socrates himself urged, or, in Plato's modification of that position, by a philosophical elite acting on behalf of all.

The section on Socrates in Antiquity is completed by three papers on Hellenistic philosophy. Two of these, by Eric Brown on Stoicism and Richard Bett on Skepticism, are conventional pieces of historiography, excellently executed. The third, Tad Brennan's 'Socrates and Epictetus' is highly unconventional. A central theme in his comparison of the two philosophers is the different ways in which they use irony, in the sense of self-denigration. For Epictetus this is the straightforward recognition of the fact that he is not a Stoic sage, but for Socrates it is frequently a weapon which he uses to humiliate opponents. Brennan connects this 'passive-aggressive hostility' (p. 292) to the intellectual pretensions of others with Socrates' attitude to physical beauty, which he claims to be entranced by but actually despises, and makes the intriguing (not to say startling) suggestion that both attitudes are to be explained by Socrates' having failed, because of his ugliness, to attract in his youth the attentions of an adult erastes. Brennan acknowledges that that is speculative, and the trouble with speculation of that kind is that it is hard to see what to do with it. It is certainly an interesting idea, but what kind of investigation could go any way towards confirming or disconfirming it? Perhaps further investigation of the erastes-eromenos relation might be of some help. How widespread was it, and in particular, would the sons of craftsmen, as distinct from the jeunesse dorée depicted in the Platonic dialogues, expect to attract erastai?

The suggestion that a comparison of the philosophical outlook and activity of Socrates with that of another ancient philosopher might usefully lead to sociological investigation of one aspect of ancient sexuality is yet further testimony, if any were needed, of the multi-faceted nature of Socrates and his legacy. Many of those facets are reflected in the second main section of the book. Having mentioned its contents briefly above, I shall not attempt any discussion of individual pieces. It suffices to say that their authors display expertise in a wide range of disciplines, and that the contents of the several pieces provide a corresponding wealth of information and (in some cases) entertainment.

Overall, the editors have done a good job. I spotted virtually no misprints, which is remarkable in a book of this size; the fact that the captions of two of the illustrations to the article on Socrates in art have been transposed is recorded on an erratum slip. They provide a preface summarizing the contents, and a useful general index, but no index locorum, which would have been helpful. Each article has its own bibliography, an arrangement which is probably more useful in a work of this kind than the provision of a general bibliography. Everyone interested in Socrates and his legacy will find something valuable in this book, which gives a most impressive picture of the vitality of contemporary Socratic studies, especially in the U.S.A.