A Companion to W.V.O. Quine

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Gilbert Harman and Ernie LePore (eds.), A Companion to W.V.O. Quine, Wiley-Blackwell, 2014, 581pp., $195.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780470672105.

Reviewed by Richard Woodward, Emmy Noether Research Group, University of Hamburg


Few figures can be claimed to have had a greater impact on post-war analytic philosophy than W.V.O. Quine. His influence on contemporary philosophy, and the consequent familiarity of his thinking, often belies the radical and revolutionary nature of his work. Like any revolutionary, Quine had destructive intentions, as is reflected in his rejection (whatever that rejection amounts to) of concepts and notions that were, and continue to be, central to philosophy as traditionally conceived. But though Quine poured doubt and scorn on such things as meaning, necessity, and apriority, his destructive intentions are best articulated and understood in positive terms. For revolutions have a positive goal: a change for the better. That Quine's revolutionary positive vision of the philosophical enterprise as one that is neither discontinuous with nor radically distinct from science can seem so innocuous is arguably the most telling and significant aspect of his philosophical legacy.

This volume, containing 26 essays by leading figures in their respective fields and edited by two of the most pre-eminent philosophers alive today, provides a comprehensive and detailed re-examination of the central aspects of Quine's work. Approaching a volume of this size on a wide range of philosophical topics can be a daunting task. Quine published over twenty books and more than a hundred articles, many of which constitute seminal contributions to a myriad of philosophy's sub-disciplines: epistemology and metaphysics, the philosophy of language and mind, the philosophy of science, formal and philosophical logic, set theory, metaphilosophy, and so on. His philosophy is an intricate (if not labyrinthine) web of interrelated elements, so coming to terms with even a single issue in Quine can be difficult. This volume isn't the best place to start when first approaching Quine (introductory books such as Chris Hookway's and Gary Kemp's give better overviews of Quine's thought), but for those wanting more detail on specific issues, it is hard to think of a more useful resource. Seasoned Quine scholars will find that many of the articles make important contributions to interpretative issues that remain alive today. This is a fantastic addition to the literature, especially for those looking for a sense of how Quine's philosophical system hangs together. Even those with less scholarly concerns will find much of value here. Indeed, I'd go as far as to say that some of the articles -- Thomas Kelly's on naturalized epistemology and Gideon Rosen's on the post-Quinean revival of speculative metaphysics spring to mind -- are required reading for anyone interested in those issues.

The volume is divided into four sections: (1) Method, (2) Language, (3) Logic, Mathematics, Science, and (4) Relation to Other Philosophers. In most cases, the labels are relatively self-explanatory. But given the topics covered in Part I, it is somewhat surprising that the heading is "Method". Some of the essays -- Peter Godfrey-Smith's on pragmatism in Quine, and Alan Weir's and Peter Hylton's respective discussions of Quine's naturalism, e.g. -- are clearly and obviously focused on methodological issues. But then what to make of the inclusion in this section of Thomas Kelly's paper on Quine's epistemology, Gary Kemp's on Quine's relationship to analytic philosophy, Lars Bergström's on apriority, or Adam Sennet and Tyrus Fisher's on paraphrase and regimentation? That the introduction has no explanation of Part I's stated focus means that some readers will understandably feel somewhat disorientated. Perhaps the major theme that emerges in the first section is Quine's relationship to some of the big "isms" in philosophical history: empiricism, rationalism, pragmatism, realism, and the naturalism that Quine promoted so heavily. I doubt that thinking of the "Method" section in this way will make total sense of such a diverse group of papers, but it might provide some hints about how the essays can be approached. The point remains that those looking for more information about a particular theme in Quine -- his epistemological views, for instance -- should look across the volume for relevant points of interaction.

Given the volume's length and topical range, rather than providing a comprehensive outline of each paper I will pick up on some of its overall themes.  I hope this will give a sense of how the volume hangs together and illustrate important connections among its chapters. My focus is obviously biased heavily by my own interests,but I hope this review will illustrate that the volume has much from which everyone can learn and profit.

1. Naturalism in Quine

Quine is often heralded as the father of naturalism, a word used so widely that one would be forgiven for thinking it a term of philosophical fashion rather than substance. Quine often expresses his naturalism in a negative way, equating naturalism with the abandonment of the goal of a first philosophy and a rejection of the idea that natural science stands in need of any supra-scientific tribunal. But if the rejection of a foundationalist Cartesian epistemology is all naturalism amounts to, many disparate philosophical movements could be classified as equally naturalistic, which threatens to rob Quine's naturalism of any distinctive content. As I intimated above, however, Quine does not intend naturalism to be a merely negative thesis. But what positive content does Quine give to his naturalism?

The obvious answer is that though Quine rejects Cartesian epistemology, he seeks to reconceive of the epistemological project as part of the wider scientific endeavour. The central task for the epistemologist is thus to perform what Weir ("Quine's Naturalism") labels the non-trivial stability test. That is, assuming the present scientific consensus, the central question in epistemology is how we, human animals as understood in contemporary biology, could come to be justified in accepting the scientific consensus that we take as our starting point. In short: if our science is true, how could we know it? This naturalized picture of the epistemological project gives Quine's naturalism a positive component, but does it exhaust it?

In one sense, the answer is clearly "no" -- it is philosophy as a whole and each of its sub-disciplines that Quine intends to be naturalized, not just epistemology. But the two essays that directly concern Quine's naturalism, Weir's and Hylton's "Quine's Naturalism Revisited", both argue that there is even more positive content to be associated with Quinean naturalism. Of the two papers, Weir's is the more radical, arguing for an interpretation of Quine on which his naturalism involves a strong form of reductionism -- an immensely surprising claim given Quine's explicit rejection of reductionism in "Two Dogmas" -- a claim that even Weir concedes is very controversial in its interpretation of Quine. For Hylton, by contrast, the crucial point is that Quine's naturalism forces scientific standards on philosophy. Indeed, as Hylton sees it, this point helps us properly articulate the sense in which Quine is sceptical of notions like meaning. Meaning, Hylton notes, is something that Quine thinks of as being a worthy object of philosophical clarification. In a passage that Hylton points to when making his case, Quine writes: "Meaning is a worthy object of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis, and is ill-suited for use as an instrument of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis" (Theories and Things, p.185). To the extent that we want to talk about meaning, then, we are free -- obliged even -- to give a scientific account of it using the best science available to us. But what Quine takes to be wrongheaded about meaning, on Hylton's interpretation, is the unreflective and uncritical acceptance of notions like meaning, necessity, and apriority. The tendency of philosophers to uncritically accept notions like meaning is, for Hylton's Quine, what threatens to render those notions unscientific. Hylton's interpretation of Quine thus shifts the focus of Quine's problem with meaning. The problem isn't that meaning is unclear or inexact -- that is inevitable given it is part of our everyday folklore. The problem is rather that meaning is simply unable to do serious philosophical work: it is a notion that is in need of explication, not one that is capable of properly explicating anything else. Hylton's reading of Quine strikes me as a very plausible interpretation, one that can be made even more substantial once we pay attention to the goals of Quinean explication. Hylton's paper provides a neat point of entry into the more general issue of how Quine conceived of explication and its role in philosophical inquiry. This issue recurs at various points throughout the volume.

2. Explication in Quine

The notion of explication central to Quine's philosophical methodology, as should be clear from above, looks similar to Carnap's. Both Carnap and Quine are distrustful of the linguistic appearances, conceived of as the things we ordinary think and say. And both think that the philosopher's task is largely a matter of replacing the unclear, imprecise concepts present in our ordinary thought and talk with clearer, more precise concepts. In that sense, Quine and Carnap agree that we should aim to replace ordinary, defective concepts with new, superior ones.

As Martin Gustafsson notes ("Quine's Conception of Explication -- and Why it Isn't Carnap's"), however, the superficial similarities between how Quine and Carnap respectively conceive of explication belie crucial differences. Carnap sees a sharp distinction between, on the one hand, the inexact and thereby defective ordinary concepts that he takes as being in need of explication and, on the other, the precise and thereby superior technical concepts to which he appeals when providing his explications. In that sense, Carnap sees explication as involving the imposition from without of technical rigour on ordinary practice. Thus, Carnap thinks that the ordinary notion of truth should be explicated in terms of more formal notions -- true-in-L -- familiar from Tarski. Quine, by contrast, does not recognize a sharp distinction here. Certainly Quine agrees that some of our ordinary practices are unclear and defective. But the more precise notions in terms of which explications are given are, for Quine, also part of ordinary practice. Moreover, in his eyes, not all of the terms found in our ordinary ways of thinking -- and the concept of truth is a particularly telling example -- are problematic. Whilst Quine, like Carnap, is distrustful of the uncritical acceptance of our ordinary practices, his conception of explication is less destructive of those practices than one might think.

That Quine had something quite specific in mind when he talks of clarification is a point that recurs in other essays. Sennet and Fisher ("Quine on Paraphrase and Regimentation") for instance, highlight the oft-forgotten point that Quine explicitly rejects the idea that a paraphrasing sentence is identical in meaning to the sentence it paraphrases. To borrow a familiar example, the idea is not that a paraphrasing sentence like "the number of children divided by the number of families is 2.4" reveals the meaning of a paraphrased sentence "the average family has 2.4 children". Rather, our goal is to first isolate the particular reasons why we wanted to talk of average families in the first place and then devise some surrogate that serves those functions in a less committal and problematic way.

According to Gustafsson, however, the kind of clarification that can be associated with paraphrase is crucially different from the kind of clarification that Quine associates with explication. In the "average family" case, for instance, an ordinary, apparently referential, concept is dismissed as defective, paraphrased away without finding a referential substitute. This is crucially different from the cases for which Quine reserves the term "explication" -- the set-theoretic explication of ordered pairs, for instance -- can be conceived of as reductive identifications. On this reading, explication takes place when we have a concept (like that of an ordered pair) for which we need a referential substitute, rather than when we have a concept (like that of an average family) that we can simply reject as defective. Explication may be elimination, but it is a softer kind of elimination than the kind of eliminative treatment that Quine gives of average families and glints.

Gustafsson's observations are useful when dealing with issues that arise at various points in Quine's philosophy, especially taken in tandem with Hylton's interpretation of the positive content of naturalism. Take Quine's views about apriority. Bergström starts "Quine and the A Priori" by stating he will argue that Quine did in fact accept that there was such a thing as a priori justification, contra the more familiar interpretations of people like Laurence BonJour and Hartry Field. Part of the problem with this way of setting up the issue is that Quine's views about apriority and analyticity were less stable than is often thought. As Weir and others note, Quine seems to have gradually pulled back from his initial extreme rejection of analyticity and apriority, by acknowledging a kind of meaning-constituting role for conditional statements of rules like &-elimination. Even putting that point aside, setting debates up in terms of whether a given philosopher "accepts something" can be notoriously unhelpful: the Quine-kosher notions of apriority that Bergström mentions clearly don't seem to articulate traditional notions of apriority anymore than the Quine-kosher notion of stimulus synonymy can be used to articulate the traditional notion of analyticity. The sense in which Field (e.g.) thinks that Quine rejects apriority is that Quine holds that embracing apriority as traditionally conceived entails embracing something that Quine rejects, i.e., unrevisable beliefs. That Quine thinks that there are various naturalistically respectable notions in the vicinity – e.g., beliefs that an agent is very unwilling to revise -- does nothing to lessen the sense in which traditional epistemic distinctions evaporate in Quine's thinking. The crucial question -- and one that echoes throughout both Quine's work and this volume -- is how we should understand the relationship between traditional philosophical notions of which Quine is suspicious and the scientifically respectable notions of which he is not. As I read Quine -- and I think that this reading is implicit in the views with which he is associated by Field -- Quine seeks an explication of the concept of the apriority and he rejects the uncritical acceptance both of apriority itself and of the concepts in terms of which analyses of apriority have been given. Talk of apriority, like talk of average men, might have a function. But when we fix on the particular functions that talk of apriority serves, we can see, Quine thinks, that more precise and less committal surrogate notions can play those roles equally well even if those explications differ in extension from the explicated notions as they are traditionally understood. In that sense, Quine is an eliminativist about apriority as much as he is an eliminativist about average families and glints elsewhere.

Or consider Quine's views about analyticity. As Gillian Russell notes in "Quine on the Analytic/Synthetic Distinction", the views about analyticity that Quine outlines in "Two Dogmas" raise tricky interpretative questions. For one, why does Quine think a failure to define "analytic" would give us a compelling reason to reject the reality of the distinction between the analytic and the synthetic? For another, how do we reconcile Quine's rejection of analyticity with his acceptance of synonymy in the guise of abbreviated definitions? Hylton's interpretation of the positive content of Quine's naturalism helps us answer these questions. The idea would be that analyticity is problematic insofar as it is the target of uncritical acceptance by the empiricist philosophers with whom Quine seeks to engage. As his discussion of abbreviated definitions makes clear, Quine is not sceptical of any attempt to explicate notions like analyticity and synonymy. The point is rather that such a Quinean explication is precisely that -- an explication -- and there is no guarantee that the extension of the legitimate explication will line up precisely with the extension of the explicated concept as it is ordinarily understood. Quine presumes that his opponents will reject such explications because they don't line up with some prior traditional understanding of analyticity. And it is precisely the dogmatic nature of such rejection that Quine regards as unscientific and which in turns renders problematic the notion of analyticity that his opponents accept. What we should be focusing on, according to Quine, is the function of analyticity -- why we wanted to say that things were analytic in the first place -- and then seeing what (if any) scientifically respectable notions play those roles.

3. Metaphysics in Quine

Whilst this volume is most impressive in its topical range, it is somewhat surprising that it does not contain more papers directly addressing Quine's views about metaphysics and its methodology, particularly in light of the prominence of metametaphysical questions in the contemporary literature. For the most part, his views about metaphysics are addressed not in isolation but as a foil for addressing some other issue. Thus, e.g., Quine's notion of ontological commitment and its connection to quantification is discussed by John Burgess ("Quine's Philosophy of Logic and Mathematics") and Michael Glanzberg ("Quine on Reference and Quantification") in connection with Quine's views in the philosophy of mathematics and logic, and Quine's notoriously opaque doctrine of ontological relativity arises at various points in connection with his views in the philosophy of language (see, e.g., Alex Orenstein's "Inscrutability Scrutinized" and Gilbert Harman's "Indeterminacy, Relativity, and Behaviorism"). My own interests may well be biased, but given that Quine is a pivotal and transitional figure in the recent history of metaphysics, I do think that the volume would have benefited had it contained some more detailed and focused entries on metaphysical and metametaphysical themes. The saving grace is that the main metaphysics-focused paper, "Quine and the Revival of Metaphysics" by Rosen, is a gem.

Rosen begins by noting that Quine was a philosopher of his times and thereby temperamentally opposed to the kind of wild speculation about the nature of reality that might be associated with the work of speculative metaphysicians. But unlike his contemporaries, Quine rejects every view in the philosophy of language and epistemology that might rule out metaphysical inquiry from the start. Quine has no views about the limits of human knowledge that would place metaphysical claims beyond our ken, nor any views about the limits of intelligibility that would render metaphysical claims nonsensical. Indeed, I suspect that he would most likely regard such views as engaging in the kind of "first-philosophy" that he loathed. His subsequent defence of metaphysics, as limited and attenuated as it is, has been so influential that when it comes to our present understanding of the metaphysical enterprise, we are, as Rosen puts it, more or less all Quineans now.

Where Carnap and those under his influence famously see severe contrast between scientific questions and metaphysical ones, Quine famously sees a continuity of cases. Questions such as Are there fermions? and Are there physical objects? might differ in their generality, but for Quine they are the same kind of questions insofar as exactly the same kind of evidence is relevant when we are trying to answer them. Quine's schematic conception of theory choice and, in particular, his conception of metaphysical inquiry can, according to Rosen, be thought of in the following way. We come to inquiry with various background beliefs that we have acquired, which we can think of as our initial theory. We then notice that it is possible to simplify our initial theory by recognizing things of a previously unrecognized kind: the Fs. Accepting Fs is a cost relative to our starting points since to recognize the existence of Fs is to recognize the existence of things of a new kind. But if the gains in simplicity are significant, updating from our initial theory to the new, F-involving theory will be justified by scientific standards and thereby justified tout court.

Those preceding remarks are, I take it, familiar enough. But as Rosen goes on to stress, Quine's wider conception of "simplicity" is far from clear. Quine tends to use "simplicity" as a catch-all term for the standard of choice that guides scientists and ordinary people when they modify their working theory in response to evidence. Simplicity so-understood amounts to something like betterness and means that our preference for simple theories amounts to nothing more than our preference for better theories. This, of course, robs the notion of much content since it leaves the nature of simplicity almost entirely up for grabs. But Quine is emphatic on two points at least: a) that considerations of theoretical simplicity and economy count as evidence of truth (rather than mere usefulness) and b) that considerations of theoretical simplicity and economy count as scientifically respectable evidence even if no additional experientially-based test is also available. These two points, according to Rosen, are crucial to seeing Quine's role in the revival of speculative metaphysics: "Quine's conception of science gives the metaphysician something to say when he is challenged to point to the testable predictions of his theory, namely, that even in science -- which is our paradigm -- testability is not required." (p. 558). Given that some philosophers – notably Huw Price -- have recently argued that Quine's metametaphysical views were far more pragmatic, positivistic, and Carnapian than is often thought, Rosen's points are a timely reminder that Quine did not recognize the kind of sharp distinction between "truth-conductive" and "merely pragmatic" reasons for preferring a theory that many of his more pragmatist rivals emphasize.

Having noted the role that the general notion of simplicity plays in Quine's conception of metaphysical inquiry, Rosen goes on to distinguish some more specific notions of simplicity to which Quine appeals when engaging in first-order metaphysical debates. Firstly, Quine argues that positing sets leads to an improvement with respect to simplicity since set theory is ideologically parsimonious and allows us to reduce the number of predicates that we regard as primitive. So, e.g., believing in sets allows us to use a set theoretical apparatus to give a definition of the two-place predicate "is an ancestor of" in terms of parenthood. Secondly, Quine argues that positing classes leads to an improvement in simplicity since set theory is ontologically parsimonious and allows us to regard various kinds of things (natural numbers, real numbers, complex numbers) as all being constructs out of one more basic kind of thing: sets. Rosen, however, regards Quine's appeals to both of these more specific concepts of simplicity as problematic given his wider views.

The appeal to ideological parsimony is problematic, Rosen thinks, because there is no real basis for thinking that ideological parsimony plays any significant role in scientific practice, rendering Quine's appeals to this kind of simplicity in conflict with his wider methodological naturalism. Moreover, the appeal to ontological parsimony is problematic, Rosen argues, because it is unclear how Quine can justify the contention that the introduction of set theoretical objects allows us to posit fewer kinds of things than before. What we want to say is that set theory leads to an improvement of ontological parsimony because it allows us to define "number" in set-theoretical terms and thereby reduce numbers to sets. But given that we can always define any predicate using various tricks, it's unclear to what exactly this amounts.

The first thing to note in response to Rosen's worries is that the two notions of parsimony are not independent from each other. True, ideologically parsimonious theories allow us to reduce the number of predicates that we take as primitive. True, ontologically parsimonious theories allow us to reduce the number of kinds that we posit. But given that the number of kinds we posit is tied to the number of primitive predicates we take to be satisfied -- and this is how I read Quine -- there is an obvious connection between the two notions of parsimony. In particular, ontological parsimony engenders ideological parsimony: if we can increase the former by reducing Fs to Gs, then we can increase the latter since we no longer need to regard the predicate "is F" as being primitive. In that sense, a preference for ideologically simple theories is reflected in scientific practice at least insofar as it is a consequence of our presumed preference for ontologically parsimonious theories.

Moreover, if Rosen is right that there is a problem with Quine's appeal to ontological parsimony, then -- given that the problem Rosen outlines arises due to worries about definitional tricks -- then exactly the same problem should arise with respect to ideological parsimony since definition plays a role there, too. In both cases, the right move to make is that the definitional tricks are blocked because there are constraints on the vocabulary in terms of which the definitions can be given. Rosen considers this idea but contends that Quine has no way of making sense of the idea that one expression might be objectively prior to another (p. 561). What is surprising here is that Quine explicitly addresses this point. In "Simple Theories of a Complex World", Quine begins by stating that our preference for simple theories is unsurprising, but goes onto note that comparative simplicity only makes sense relative to a background choice of vocabulary or conceptual apparatus, and concludes that "simplicity, whilst not subjective, is at any rate parochial." If Quine's discussion in this paper is anything to go by, his conception of theory choice does indeed recognize both that comparisons of simplicity require us to privilege a choice of vocabulary and that some choices of vocabulary are objectively privileged. Exactly how to understand what Quine is after here continues, of course, a vexed question. But the point remains that the view Rosen takes to be un-Quinean seems to be precisely the view that Quine himself holds.

4. Concluding Remarks

Given the depth, breadth, and length of the volume, I have only been able to scratch its surface in this review. I hope that I have given a sense of some of its important themes, in particular those regarding Quine's naturalism, his conception of philosophical inquiry, and the resources to which he thinks we as philosophers can legitimately appeal. Other readers will no doubt pick up on other themes, which is indicative of the quality and usefulness of the volume's essays. Much of our contemporary philosophical worldview can be thought of as post-Quinean along some dimension or other, and this volume is a wonderfully useful resource both for those who want to learn more about Quine's specific views in a given area and those who want to learn more about how his views hang together to form a distinctive and powerful worldview. For those interested in Quine's work, the essays are, quite simply, essential reading.