A Comparative Analysis of Cicero and Aquinas: Nature and the Natural Law

Placeholder book cover

Charles P. Nemeth, A Comparative Analysis of Cicero and Aquinas: Nature and the Natural Law, Bloomsbury, 2017, 192pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350009462.

Reviewed by Tony Burns, University of Nottingham


This book is, as the title suggests, a comparative study of the thought of Cicero and Saint Thomas Aquinas, focusing on the issue of their respective attitudes towards the notion of natural law. Charles Nemeth's thesis is that 'the natural law philosophies of Cicero and Aquinas, at least in a broad, very general sense, are remarkably similar' (p. 135). Indeed, when they 'are placed side by side, the similarities outweigh the differences' (p. 134). There is evidently some justification for holding this view. It seems to me, however, that Nemeth's over-states his case and that he has a tendency to downplay the significance of a number of differences between the natural law theory of Aquinas and that of Cicero.

I had the impression when reading the book that there was an 'elephant in the room,' namely Aristotle. It is generally accepted, and rightly so, that the ethical thought of Aquinas generally, including his reflections on natural law, owes a great deal to Aristotle. However, much the same might also be said of Cicero. As Charles H. Lyttle has noted, 'it should be remembered' that the thinking of 'Cicero himself was avowedly and deeply indebted to Aristotle,' with respect to a number of issues.[1] This complicates matters for anybody wishing to compare and contrast the ideas of Aquinas and Cicero.

Throughout his book, Nemeth attempts to systematically downplay the significance of Aristotle, both for the history of natural law theory in general, and also for the thinking of Aquinas on this subject, in order to lend support to his claim that the views of Aquinas are closest to those of Cicero. See, for example, his claim that Aristotle 'provides little if any guidance on the natural law' (p. 79; also p. 135) and his observation that 'some have argued,' one presumes rightly in Nemeth's view, that Cicero and not Aristotle 'was the "father" of the natural law concept' (p. 78). I very much doubt that Aquinas would have agreed with this claim. Moreover, if it were true, it would be difficult to understand why so much has been written about the subject of natural law in Aristotle and in the Aristotelian political tradition.

Nemeth does not attach sufficient importance to the differences that exist between the ideas of Aquinas and those of Cicero. In this respect, the argument is somewhat unbalanced. An example of this is the claim, which he makes on a number of occasions, that the natural law theory of Cicero, like that of Aquinas, not only rests upon a theological foundation (pp. 30-31, 74, 94-5) of a certain kind, but also, more specifically, goes beyond the pantheism of the Stoic philosophers. For example, at one point Nemeth says that, contrary to a widely held opinion, Cicero 'rejects a pantheistic God,' although he concedes that 'some may find otherwise' (p. 74). And elsewhere he states that, again 'contrary to popular perception,' for Cicero, God is not 'a simple synonym with nature itself' (p. 95). Nemeth has two reasons for believing this. The first is that, in his opinion, if Cicero's natural law theory were 'to have a scintilla of certitude,' it would 'have to admit the role of a transcendent God,' this being so because 'a failure to do so relegates,' or rather would relegate, 'the theory to endless relativity' (p. 94). This seems to me to be a dubious argument.

Nemeth's second argument is that there is at least some evidence that counts against such a reading of Cicero's theoretical position. Indeed, he suggests that the view that Cicero was an adherent of the pantheism of the Stoics 'seems short sighted and even erroneous when the full body of Cicero's texts are reviewed' (p. 135). Here Nemeth seems to rely heavily on the work of S. Adam Seagrave,[2] although he does present some of the relevant evidence in his own right. Interestingly, one aspect of this second argument is that, with respect to this particular issue, Nemeth maintains that the views of Cicero are remarkably similar to those of Aristotle. As Nemeth observes, Cicero's 'descriptions of God,' especially his references to the idea of a 'Prime Mover,' are 'amazingly Aristotelian in scope and design' (p. 95). This reinforces the suggestion, made earlier, that it might have been better to offer a systematic comparison of the views of Cicero, Aquinas and Aristotle together, rather than of just Cicero and Aquinas alone.

It should, however, be noted that Nemeth is not entirely consistent when discussing the issue of Cicero and the pantheism of the Stoics. For example, he twice refers to Cicero as 'a renowned secular figure' (p. 4) and as 'a pagan and secular thinker' (p. 77). These remarks seem to me to contradict his claim that 'on close examination it is difficult to discern extraordinary differences between' the conceptual frameworks of Aquinas and Cicero. Moreover, on another occasion Nemeth appears to accept rather than reject the view that, unlike Aquinas, Cicero did have a 'Stoical tendency,' in that he endorsed the belief 'that God or the gods are part of the created universe whereby God is merely nature itself -- none of which,' he observes, would be 'acceptable to any Thomist' (p. 78).

Nemeth refers more than once to the 'scientific' character of Aquinas's speculations about natural law (pp. xii, 45, 123). He suggests that this is a difference between the outlook of Aquinas and that of Cicero. He accepts that this is something that Aquinas has in common with Aristotle rather than Cicero. Nemeth acknowledges at one point that 'it is glaringly apparent that Thomas favours the Aristotelian way while Cicero the Platonic vision of reality' (p. 33). He also says that 'compared with Cicero, Aquinas sees the world a bit more empirically and scientifically, as would Aristotle,' and that 'Aquinas clearly prefers Aristotle's Physics while Cicero delights in Plato's Laws and his Republic' (p. 45). These observations are well-founded. However, they are in tension with the broad thrust of the argument of the book as a whole, which as we have seen is to downplay the significance of the differences that exist between the ideas of Cicero and Aquinas. Although others would disagree, Nemeth evidently thinks that these differences between the views of Cicero and Aquinas are not significant in comparison with the similarities.

One issue that arises when reading this book is that of the part that the concept of God has to play in the ethical thought of Cicero and Aquinas. Nemeth maintains that, in the case of both thinkers, the concept is an important one. There is a theological bent to the natural law speculations of both thinkers. However, what is required here is a more detailed account of the specific nature of this role, focusing on differences as well as similarities. So far as similarities are concerned, Nemeth claims that for both Cicero and Aquinas, without the concept of God we would be left with ethical and cultural relativism. However, Nemeth does not explain satisfactorily why he thinks this. Moreover, such a view has been challenged by at least some of theorists associated with the natural law tradition. For example, as the great Jesuit student of jurisprudence Francisco Suarez noted in his De Legibus ac deo legislatore (1612), there was a strand of natural law speculation throughout the medieval period according to which the universally valid precepts of natural law would be morally binding even if there were no God. According to at least some natural law theorists, therefore, it is possible to have a system of ethics that succeeds in avoiding cultural relativism, and which is undeniably a theory of natural law, but in which the concept of God does not have a significant part to play. This form of natural law theorizing is, of course, usually associated with Hugo Grotius and the Prolegomena to his De Jure belli ac pacis (1625).

The question here is whether the precepts of natural law are thought of as possessing a binding force independently of any divine command, or precisely because of the existence of such a command This is of course the well-known debate between nominalists and realists, or between rationalists and voluntarists, which exercised a number of theologians in the late medieval period, but which first emerged in the Euthyphro of Plato. Are the actions which are required by natural law right or wrong because God commands or forbids them, or does God command or forbid these actions because they are essentially right or wrong? The former view is usually associated with voluntarism and the latter with realism.

It is arguable and seems to be generally accepted that, as Suarez observes, Aquinas's position in this debate is not to be identified with either one of its two poles. He is neither a voluntarist like Jean Gerson, Pierre d'Ailly and William of Ockham, nor a realist like Grotius and his scholastic predecessors, including Gregory of Rimini, Hugh Saint Victor, Gabriel Biel, Jacob Almain and Antonio de Corduba. Rather, he seeks to establish an intermediate position, a third-way which seeks a via media between these two extremes. According to Aquinas, on this reading, certain actions are essentially right or wrong in and of themselves. They are not right or wrong because of any divine command. We have, therefore, a number of corresponding principles of natural right. However, individual moral agents are under a perfect or binding moral obligation to either perform or refrain from performing such actions only because they have been commanded to do so by God. It is God's divine command which transforms the principles of natural right into principles of natural law, in the strict sense of the term.

Given this, if the claim that there is very little significant difference between the natural law theorizing of Aquinas and Cicero is to be sustained, then it would be necessary to establish that a similar view to that held by Aquinas on this issue could and should also be attributed to Cicero. This is an important feature of the natural law theory of Aquinas, and arguably a significant difference between his views and those of Cicero. Nemeth does not pay sufficient attention or attach enough importance to the differences that exist between the respective outlooks of Aquinas and Cicero with respect to this particular issue.

Another topic regarding which the views of Cicero and those of Aquinas are significantly different is that of the alleged mutability or changeability of the natural law. Nemeth rightly observes that, according to Cicero, the precepts of natural law are 'eternal and unchangeable,' that is to say, 'valid for all nations and all times' (p. 31). At the same time, however, he accepts that, in the Summa Theologica, Aquinas follows what Aristotle has to say about this subject in Book V, Chapter 7 of the Nicomachean Ethics and endorses the view that, although the natural law 'is altogether unchangeable in its first principles,' nevertheless, the secondary precepts of natural law 'may be changed' in certain circumstances (p. 151). What exactly Aristotle and/or Aquinas mean by this is controversial and has provoked much discussion. The point however, for present purposes, is that Aquinas accepted the view that at least some of the principles of natural law may be regarded as changeable, in some sense of the term, whereas Cicero did not. Again, therefore, it is only by downgrading the significance of the idea of changeability for the natural law theory of Aquinas that it is possible to argue that his views and those of Cicero are essentially one and the same. Needless to say, with respect to this particular issue, it is Aristotle rather than Cicero who is followed more closely by Aquinas.

We may also consider what Nemeth has to say about what are usually referred to as the problems of practical ethics, i.e. the question of right and wrong in the case of such issues as abortion, suicide, euthanasia, homosexuality and bestiality (pp. x, 40, 136-37, 140, 143-5, 149-50). One of the things that is readily apparent from Nemeth's discussion of these problems is that, despite his claim that the views of Aquinas and Cicero regarding the principles of natural law are much the same, in fact their judgments regarding the rights and wrongs of a number of these practices differ significantly from one another. Nemeth accepts for example that, 'as with abortion,' when 'compared with Aquinas,' it is clear that Cicero 'fails to deduce the incompatibility of suicide/euthanasia with natural law reasoning' (p. 140).

One thing that is missing from Nemeth's book is a discussion of the issue of personal identity, or of the nature of the self, which is also the issue of legal subjectivity. What is the nature of the individual moral agent who has a duty to obey the precepts of natural law? The answer that is given is influenced by our understanding of the mind or soul and the relationship in which it stands to the body. This is important because, with respect to these questions, Aquinas is a follower of the position taken by Aristotle in his De Anima, whereas the views of Cicero are closer to those of Plato and the Stoic philosophers who followed him. By not discussing this issue, upon which Plato and Aristotle were in fundamental disagreement with one another, Nemeth neglects to consider another significant point of difference between the views of Cicero and those of Aquinas.

There is no sustained discussion in Nemeth's book of the methodological issues involved in a comparison of the ideas of two thinkers whose lives are separated by a span of more than a thousand years. I do not myself think that there is something inappropriate about this. However, an enthusiast for the approach to intellectual history that is usually associated with the work of J. G. A. Pocock, Quentin Skinner and the Cambridge School might well take issue with some of Nemeth's assumptions, for example his reference to 'perennial ideas' (p. 4). It would have been good to see a detailed, explicit defence of the methodological assumptions upon which the argument of the book is based.

Overall, this is an interesting book and one that is well worth reading, even though, as I have attempted to show, the author's case that the natural law theories of Aquinas and Cicero are much the same is over stated.

[1]Charles H. Lyttle, 'Review of E. K. Rand, Cicero in the Courtroom of St. Thomas Aquinas,' Church History, 15, 4 (1946), p. 310.

[2]S. Adam Seagrave, 'Cicero, Aquinas and Contemporary Issues in Natural Law Theory,' Review of Metaphysics, 62, 4 (2009), pp. 491-523.