A Cosmopolitan Hermit: Modernity and Tradition in the Philosophy of Josef Pieper

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Bernard N. Schumacher (ed.), A Cosmopolitan Hermit: Modernity and Tradition in the Philosophy of Josef Pieper, Catholic University of America Press, 2009, 312pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813217086.

Reviewed by Kevin White, The Catholic University of America



Josef Pieper (1904-1997), the German “cosmopolitan hermit” commemorated by this collection, was one of the great Catholic philosophers of the last century. Catholicism gave him his themes, which were creation, cult (or what is now blandly called liturgy), tradition, virtue, and the spiritual, yet time-conditioned, character of human thought and action. The work of Aquinas provided him with material and stimulation for his meditations on these themes. Pieper maintained that, in his efforts to think about them, he remained a philosopher and did not become a theologian. He deployed a lucid style, tending toward the aphoristic, that intensely focuses attention on what is being discussed, giving his prose “that eye on the object look,” to take a phrase from W. H. Auden. Going beyond the question of an indeterminately Christian philosophy, Pieper’s work is, in effect, an argument for a specifically Catholic philosophy, in the sense of a philosophy that is inspired by Catholicism in its presuppositions, preoccupations, and vocabulary, but one that also attempts to clarify human experience in a placid, open way that can be made intelligible, and even illuminating, to non-Catholics.

“Aphorisms,” as Francis Bacon says, “representing a knowledge broken, do invite men to enquire farther, whereas Methods” — i.e., fulsome treatises in rounded prose — “carrying the show of a total, do secure men as if they were at furthest” — i.e., make them feel sure of themselves, as if they were in full, complacent possession of whatever there is to be known about a thing. Not only did Pieper incline toward aphorism himself; he also read Aquinas with an eye out for the concise and telling remark that invites reflection, such as his metaphorical description of prudence as genetrix (Gebärerin) of, or giver of birth to, the moral virtues of justice, courage, and moderation. That Aquinas is merely the reporter, not the originator, of this metaphor mattered little to Pieper, for, on one hand, Aquinas’s value, in his view, lies as much in his role as summarizer and transmitter of a common tradition as in any “originality” that can be isolated in his work, while, on the other hand, the end of the study of philosophy, as Pieper liked to recall Aquinas having said, is to know not what men have thought, but how it stands with the truth of things. (There’s a nice paradox in there.) It is characteristic of Pieper’s way of commenting to begin by observing how alien and unreal the image of prudence as “mother” of the other virtues seems at first sight to modern readers, but then to make a case that it in fact conveys something that is both true and of urgent importance. Pieper even turned Aquinas into an aphorist, producing an ordered selection of sententiae from the Thomistic corpus (Sentenzen über Gott und die Welt [tr. The Human Wisdom of St. Thomas: A Breviary of Philosophy from the Works of St. Thomas Aquinas]). In this arrangement of Thomas’s pensées, as in his own compositions, Pieper puts qualities of brevity, order, and concentration of thought in the service of a pedagogy that quickly leads the reader to the verge of thinking for himself. Such qualities make many of Pieper’s works models of the “streamlined Thomism” that Robert Sokolowski has called for in the teaching of philosophy at Catholic institutions.

The present collection consists of ten contributions, fully half of which have been translated into English, a proportion that raises the subject of Pieper’s fortunes in the English speaking world. His first work to appear in English was Leisure, The Basis of Culture. It is probably his book best known to the English-speaking public at large, in part because of its argument, which concerns the deep, spiritual restlessness of the modern world, but also, in part, because it has had the good luck to be introduced to English-speaking readers by three distinguished native speakers: the original translation, by Alexander Dru, was published in 1952 with an introduction by T. S. Eliot; a second translation, by Gerald Malsbary, appeared in 1998 with an introduction by Roger Scruton; and the original translation was republished in 2009 with an introduction by James V. Schall. On the other hand, Pieper’s work best known to scholars and students at North American Catholic colleges and universities is perhaps The Four Cardinal Virtues, which has been in print since 1965. Quite independently of, and for the most part prior to, the so-called virtue ethics associated with Anscombe, MacIntyre, and Foot (cf. Thomas S. Hibbs’s contribution to the present collection), this work — which is in fact a gathering of four essays — has for decades been introducing curious undergraduates to the meaning of moral virtue, to the ancient distinction of four “cardinal” virtues, and to a learned but unpretentious way of speaking about them in an English derived from Pieper’s recapitulations in German of what Aquinas had said about them in Latin. In short, The Four Cardinal Virtues has functioned for some time as an instance, or rather four instances, of a streamlined Thomism, and in this regard it might profitably be imitated.

The collection opens with an introduction by the editor (“A Cosmopolitan Hermit: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Josef Pieper”) that surveys Pieper’s career, dividing it into two major phases. Three influential youthful encounters are described: with a professor who suggested to Pieper that Aquinas’s commentary on the prologue to the Gospel of St. John would provide more philosophical nourishment than the “Danish pastries” of Kierkegaard’s works; with Romano Guardini, who made clear to Pieper that reality is the measure of human thought and action, that is, that the good presupposes the true; and with Erich Przywara, who taught Pieper to resist systematization in philosophy. (“System” would seem to be akin to Bacon’s “Method,” i.e., an opposite to aphorism, and an enemy of watchfulness and insight.) The introduction goes on to discuss Pieper’s gradual development of a philosophy of virtue in a series of essays, published between 1934 and 1972, on the four cardinal and three theological virtues, each of the seven essays coming about in “a precise historical context” of its own (10). In 1946 Pieper defended his Habilitationschrift on “the truth of things,” a theme that is corollary to the metaphysics of creation by a divine intellect (cf. Matthew Cuddeback’s contribution here). The second phase of Pieper’s career began on July 5, 1946, with a lecture on education and intellectual labor that inaugurated “a philosophy of culture aimed at defending and promoting the human person” (16). This introductory survey situates each of the other nine contributions against the background of some theme or work in Pieper’s career.

These other nine naturally divide into three groups of three. The first three are by German scholars who present the intellectual and political context in which Pieper’s thinking emerged, as well as his early work in sociology: Berthold Wald (“Josef Pieper in the Context of Modern Philosophy”), Frank Töpfer (“Josef Pieper on the Intellectual Foundations of Totalitarianism”), and Hermann Braun (“Josef Pieper’s Early Sociological Writings”).

Wald discusses Pieper in the context of three twentieth-century crises concerning, respectively, the nature of philosophy, the spiritual situation of the modern world after 1945, and the contemporary image of the human being. The first crisis was about whether priority should be given to reference or point of view, an artificial opposition that Pieper avoided by taking as his starting point “the usual speech and thought of men as oriented toward knowing and action” (27). Standing aloof from responses to the second crisis by Horkeimer and Adorno, Heidegger, and Gadamer, Pieper developed his reflections on leisure, worship, and creation. Of Heidegger, Pieper wrote: "It was above all the language of this writer" — in fact, his language about language — “that I could not trust, nor, consequently, the writer himself” (34, n.37). In response to the third crisis, Pieper put forth his understanding of virtue as “the enhancement of the human being in a way befitting his nature” (61).

Töpfer sets Pieper’s early Grundformen sozialer Spielregeln (1933) against the background of Tönnies’s Gemeinschaft und Gesellschaft (1887). Tönnies’s favoring of Gemeinschaft has affinities with both German romanticism and National Socialism. Pieper adds a third form of social relations, Organisation, in which, as in an orchestra, members are functionaries working in view of a common goal, and not in view of the organization as a group or its members as persons. Pieper sees totalitarianism as an absolutizing of this form; Töpfer sees it rather as “a combination of communal absolutism and organizational practice that is at the service of the communal” (78). Töpfer characterizes Leisure, the Basis of Culture as an anti-totalitarian work, and praises Pieper as a defender of human happiness who discovered forms of “theoretical” happiness in unexpected places, for instance, in the consideration of a loved one or a work of art.

Braun’s piece begins and ends strikingly. He first offers an eloquent description of Pieper’s fidelity to Aquinas: Pieper neither “judged” nor “interpreted” Aquinas, but united judgment and interpretation in bringing forth what was “substantial and authentic” in Aquinas. Braun describes Pieper’s sociological thought during 1928-32, when he worked for Johann Plenge’s Research Institute for Organizational Studies and Sociology, and eventually concluded that “sociology needs clear basic concepts” (99). In 1934, Pieper was at first hopeful of an affinity between Catholicism and National Socialism, but after the Röhm affair of June, 1934, he came to see that justice did not rule under National Socialism. Yet he continued for some time to think that the National Socialist state was a lesser evil than the Weimar democracy it had replaced. Braun quotes from a letter written in April 1933 by Edith Stein (who, like Pieper, lived in Münster) to Pope Pius XI, on the oppression of Jews under National Socialism, and he closes by raising the “painfully relevant” question of why the letter seems to come from another world than that that from which Pieper speaks (115).

The next three contributions, by Thomas S. Hibbs (“Josef Pieper and the Ethics of Virtue”), Joseph J. Godfrey ("The Future of Pieper’s Hope and History“), and Kenneth Schmitz (”Josef Pieper and the Concept of Tradition") bring out a set of topics — virtue, history, and tradition - that are closely interlaced in Pieper’s thinking about human nature.

Hibbs sets Pieper’s reflections on the cardinal and theological virtues in contrast to both the tradition of casuistry against which Pieper was reacting and the virtue ethics that developed after Pieper’s virtue essays appeared. He provides a thoughtful epitome of each of the essays, and offers illuminating generalizations: “Precisely because there are competing accounts of the virtues and because any generic account is misleadingly shallow, Pieper typically begins with a critique of misunderstandings of the virtue in question, misconceptions operative either within the current culture or within a rival philosophical school” (131); Pieper’s “view of the virtues constitutes in itself a sort of anthropology, a conception of human nature, its good, and the means to attainment” (138).

Godfrey, the author of A Philosophy of Human Hope (1987), revisits Pieper’s Hope and History (1967) with two questions. How should most of us, who are “ants” in our inability to see far ahead into the future, respond to the reports of “eagles” who claim to see far ahead, reports that may differ from one another? And why should we pay attention to any such report, especially in light of Pieper’s suggestion that the truly hopeful apply their energy not so much to grand plans as to “the everyday accomplishment, in each given situation, of what is wise, good, and just” (143)? Godfrey compares Pieper’s reflections on history with the secular views of Francis Fukuyama and Robert Wright and the religious views of Johann Metz and the Catechism of the Catholic Church. He says that “Pieper is rightly skeptical about the plausibility of any view purporting to recognize patterns in history” (168), but suggests that he does not sufficiently acknowledge that efforts to discern the direction of history “are helpful and needful for discerning how to choose when one is attempting to devote energy to ‘the everyday accomplishment’” (169). "Hope and History," Godfrey concludes, “continues to be a model, even if an incomplete model, for conversation between evolutionary historical thought and religious eschatological thought” (170).

Schmitz discusses the elements of Pieper’s concept of tradition, among which are the idea of tradition as something handed down, unchanged, as a truth, and a shaping of time and of “place” by the intervals between master and disciple. He condenses Pieper’s contrast between history and tradition into a distinction between the epistemic authority of the former and the ontological authority of the latter (177). He also discusses the prominent loci of tradition according to Pieper: biblical, especially Christian religion; pre and extra-Christian mythology, which constitutes something like a “primordial revelation,” and which reaches a high point in the work of Plato; the “unconscious certainties” of human existence that Jungian psychology tries to get at; and language itself. Schmitz considers — with some surprise, reserve, and perhaps skepticism — the seriousness with which Pieper thought Plato took the so-called “Great Myth,” at whose core Pieper identified three beliefs that he aligned with the Christian teachings of creation, sin, and redemption respectively. In a coda, Schmitz traces the initial steps of philosophizing as Pieper understands it: a “loving” sense of surprise; an approach to “the whole,” “with no holds barred”; an acknowledgement of the given character of the humanum, “the human thing”; an inquiry into the order from which human beings emerge; and a recognition of the inexhaustible intelligibility of all things.

The last three contributions, by Bernard N. Schumacher (“The Twofold Discipleship of the Philosopher: Faith and Reason in the Thought of Josef Pieper”), Matthew Cuddeback (“Josef Pieper on the Truth of All Things and the World’s True Face”), and Juan F. Franck (“The Platonic Inspiration of Pieper’s Philosophy”), clarify the two sources that Pieper’s thinking brings together, namely, the Catholic doctrine of creation and Plato’s portrayals of the activity of philosophizing.

Schumacher presents Pieper’s view of philosophy as openness to the totality of being and his understanding of theology as theios logos, divine speech addressed to human beings. He then starts asking questions that Pieper did not.

Which theology is our concern? … What criteria are used to judge one theology as superior to another? … Pieper avoids questions such as these that underlie his position, and is satisfied to describe the intrinsic structure of the philosophical act which is, by nature, open to pre-philosophical data (217-8).

Schumacher is clearly sympathetic with Pieper’s view that Christ and Christianity have radically and permanently changed the game for philosophy, but he finds wanting Pieper’s articulation of his position. Schumacher’s pairing of “faith and reason” in his title may allude to recent papal documents, suggesting that they can help complete what Pieper began to say on this matter.

Cuddeback gives an account of Pieper’s teaching on the truth of things, starting from the statement omne ens est verum, “an utterance handed down within what Pieper calls ‘holy tradition’” (229). The teaching has three basic elements: “God sees and makes all things by His ideas; the creature is shaped by God and so is knowable; the creature is shaped by God and so unfathomable.” Cuddeback mounts a defense of the first of these elements by examining Summa theologiae I, qq.14-15 more closely than Pieper did. He draws attention to Pieper’s Thomistic use of light as an image of the “knowableness” and “inexhaustibleness” of creatures, and to his frequent citation of Aquinas’s remark that Ipsa actualitas rei est quodammodo lumen ipsius: a thing’s actuality is a light it gives off (239). And he thoughtfully retrieves Pieper’s retrieval of the medieval theme of the “word-character” of things, a theme arising from the doctrine of creation. Pieper’s development of this theme is “the full flower of his teaching on truth, and something he intended as a word of hope for his troubled age” (229-30).

Finally, Franck considers Pieper’s attention to Plato in commentaries and essays, as well as in radio and television broadcasts of lectures on and adaptations of some dialogues. Franck addresses the following Platonic themes: the concept of an academy as a place where theoria is cultivated; Pieper’s application to the study of Plato the principle that such study must teach us about the world in which we live; Pieper’s Augustinian construal of the Platonic doctrines of recollection and pre-existence; the deleterious influence of sophists, who cannot converse, because they are indifferent both to the essence of things and to their hearers; philosophizing as a search, necessarily incomplete, for god-like knowledge of the whole and of the archetypes of things; and Pieper’s emphasis on Plato’s use of myths and on the Platonic theme of the soul’s immortality.

This fine collection is warmly recommended both to the connoisseur of Pieper’s work and to anyone who is merely curious about this instructive and suggestive thinker.