A Dark History of Modern Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Bernard Freydberg, A Dark History of Modern Philosophy, Indiana University Press, 2017, 146pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253029461.

Reviewed by Brad Frazier, Wells College


The title of this book could be taken many ways. It could denote a history of modern philosophy in the tradition of Susan Neiman's excellent work, Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy. On Neiman's alternative approach, theodicy displaces epistemology as the ultimate concern of the modern period.

However, Freydberg departs from the traditional approach in a different way. He seeks to uncover an underlying, unacknowledged chaos or "primal lack" to which all the so-called rationalists and empiricists respond, with differing levels of awareness of what they are doing. He considers the epistemic-centric reading of modern philosophy to be "so obvious" that it has "long provoked an uneasy discomposure" in him (1). It turns out that this unease can be articulated but not altogether exorcised, as it belongs "inherently in the history of modern philosophy" (1).

Freydberg situates his history in relation to the standard reading as follows:

What I am proposing is the following alteration of the standard narrative even as it seems most incontestable. The divisions within the standard narrative do not concern -- at least do not essentially concern -- the role of "reason" on one side and the role of "experience" on the other. Rather, both of these putative divisions respond to the darkness to which we are all given over. While this darkness can be called by many names, it escapes all of them: abyss, ignorance, death, impenetrability, Hades. (11)

This brings us to the "dark" part of Freydberg's history of modern philosophy. He states that his overall goal is to reveal this "crucially concealed dimension" of modern philosophy. But what does he mean by this? Here's how he explains it:

The great era of modern philosophy took its departure from another great era, that of Greek thought. But in so doing, modern philosophy suppressed that dark, Delphic region accessible by nonrational means alone. Suppression, however, does not and cannot mean elimination, cancellation, and can never mean Aufhebung, Hegel's term that includes negating, overcoming and surpassing. The dark origin of modern philosophy roils everywhere beneath its rational surface, giving modern philosophy life even as its progeny seek to deny this darkness. (1)

In his discussion of Kant, Freydberg glosses the darkness as follows:

Whether all-destroyer, all-savior, or both, the grand synthesis that is the Kantian Philosophy is ultimately erected upon the same abyssal origin as those of his noble Predecessors. In The Critique of Pure Reason it has two names, each standing in for a separate kind of absence. The first, thing in itself (or things in themselves) stands in for whatever might be utterly beyond the realm of knowledge for a human being. The second, noumenon (or noumena) stands in for the nonexistent object of reason (or of the class of such objects). Subtract these absences, and rationalist metaphysics returns, with its unsolvable conundrums, so too does empiricism, with its own impenetrable aporiai. It is difficult indeed to imagine primal lack with such exceptional power! (24)

In a prelude to chapter two, Freydberg calls this primal lack anteriority and elaborates it. He notes:

Anteriority provides the guiding thread . . . of this discourse. One might characterize anteriority in various ways: as primordial, as prephilosophical, as preconceptual, as prerational, as dwelling beneath, as abyss, as chasm, as underpinning undergirding, as roiling beneath, as resounding from beneath, or other such formulations. (33)

In the same context, Freydberg refers to anteriority as "radical otherness." Ironically, for such an inherently elusive concept, anteriority is easier for Freydberg to spot in each modern philosopher's thought. So many things can be signs or symbols of anteriority, with enough imagination, learning, and effort, it is possible to interpret the entire history of modern philosophy through this lens.

However, Freydberg cannot simply focus on what's already out in the open for everyone to see, i.e., modern philosophers' ideas. Rather, as he explains: "I attempt to turn attention away from the doctrines and toward those realms rendered inaccessible by modern means. In other words, at the juncture where thought breaks off, the most intriguing areas of all solicit our apprehension. I call these junctures fissures." (2)

So Freydberg must go fissure hunting in modern philosophy. Where to look? What causes fissures? That's the wrong question, it turns out, because it presupposes that fissures are something akin to effects of philosophical concepts and their interrelations. Freydberg refers to this assumption as "the order dictated by the customary prejudice." On the contrary, he claims, "the fissures make the doctrines possible." Or more simply, "the fissures animate the doctrines" (2). In some sense, then, fissures are prior to doctrines and give life to them.

This approach yields a history of modern philosophy that consists of an introduction, three main chapters, brief sections that serve as segues between the chapters, and a coda at the end. Chapter one, "Fissures in the History of Modern Philosophy," is followed -- after the prelude noted above -- by an erudite treatment of Spinoza in chapter two, "Spinoza's Abysmal Rationalism." Between chapters two and three, Freydberg addresses German Idealism briefly, in a section entitled, "Intermezzo: On the Putative History of German Idealism." Chapter three, "Unruly Greek Schelling," is devoted to Schelling and his "Greek underpinnings." The coda, "Nietzsche as Crux," brings the book to 130 pages.

It might seem surprising that Spinoza and Schelling get their own chapters, while in chapter one, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume are each covered in three pages or fewer. Also, the discussion of Descartes is only slightly more elaborate, while Kant gets more attention as the focus of the final section of the chapter (eight pages). The spotlight on Spinoza and Schelling is a consequence of Freydberg's motif of darkness. As he reads them, Spinoza goes to the greatest lengths to suppress anteriority in his (monistic) system, while Schelling is most receptive and alert to it. As Freydberg explains:

In Spinoza, the suppression of the dark and living region of philosophy's history is so thoroughgoing that access to it requires the closest attention in order to discover the entryways to this obscure region. By contrast, in Schelling the dark region becomes explicit and moves to prominence alongside the brighter manifestations of reason and rule. In the Coda on Nietzsche, mythos takes over. The Apollinian/Dionysian duplicity (Duplicität) not only replaces reason as the basis of philosophy but also demotes it to a weak, second-order recourse. (7)

As a history of modern philosophy, this book is very uneven. Freydberg engages some major philosophers very briefly and dismissively. For instance, he devotes roughly one page to Locke, and in that short space makes reference to Locke's "silly arguments and rhetorical flourishes" without even trying to explain the basis of his criticism (18). Instead he briefly mentions Locke in order to identify -- in a way that feels forced, not just with Locke but also in other cases -- the main "fissure" disclosed by Locke's views. It turns out unsurprisingly to be his concept of substance.

When Freydberg turns to Descartes, he notes acidly, "When both sides of the current philosophical divide agree on a particular matter, my rule of thumb is to regard both sides as mistaken and to proceed under that assumption until proven wrong. In the case of René Descartes, this rule of thumb has provided the correct course" (12). Then Freydberg needlessly disparages the widely held view (across both traditions) that Descartes is a substance dualist. He describes Descartes' dualism a different way: res cogitans and all else, which is radically other (14).

But, for Freydberg, it is not Descartes' dualism but his reliance on probability that signals a fissure in his thought. For Descartes, establishing probability "requires sense and imagination as its initial spurs," not reason (15). So, the ultimate origins of probability are nonrational, however rational a tool it may seem.

Freydberg refers to Leibniz as a "so-called rationalist," and locates a fissure in his conception of goodness. For Leibniz, goodness means "(1) disposition of everything in the best manner, and (2) a way of truth disclosure that is unavailable to a merely mechanical approach" (17). In defense of the coherence of Leibniz's optimism, Freydberg criticizes Voltaire for lacking the insight "or even a competent imagination" to grasp this distinction. A world full of horrors, such as our own, could still technically be the best possible world in the second sense of goodness noted above, according to Freydberg. (If only Voltaire could have been a subtler reader of Leibniz.)

Freydberg's discussions of Hume and especially Kant are developed at greater depth and with more sympathy. Still there is a sense that Freydberg is fissure hunting. He locates a fissure in Hume's famous problem of induction and his appeal to nature as a salve against the skepticism that it produces (23). In Kant's philosophy, a fissure surfaces, as noted above, in regard to his notion of a "thing in itself." In each case, reason collides with its inevitable need of the nonrational.

In the prelude on anteriority that follows chapter one, Freydberg notes that the Greek concept of Chaos, as he employs it to illuminate anteriority, "has nothing to do with order or disorder but rather, to borrow a Kantian trope, is the condition for the possibility of anything like order and disorder" (36). Perhaps there is a clue here as to how to interpret the relationships between philosophers' concepts and the fissures in their thought. But the issue remains very obscure.

Freydberg's chapters on Spinoza and Schelling are the most expansive and erudite parts of the book. In an impressive display of range in scholarship, he references Greek tragedies, Heraclitus, Parmenides, Euclid, Plato, and even Einstein to situate and to articulate Spinoza's views on God, freedom, and necessity. He claims that, for Spinoza, "God is anteriority -- unconditionally, absolutely, exclusively. God, or Nature, must be conceived" (41). Or stated another way, in Spinoza's philosophy, "God must be thought of as that anteriority in terms of which all 'inside' and 'outside' can occur at all" (43). At the end of the chapter, Freydberg puts the point this way: God's impersonality is "Spinoza's inscribed suppression of the Greek eros" (75). In the same context, however, he states that the image of Socrates "serves as Spinoza's singular anteriority" (71). How do we think these thoughts together? Freydberg offers little guidance.

This brings me to a question that plagued me throughout the book. Who is the intended audience? The book is far too uneven and sour to be used in a course. It is not written for an intellectually inclined public. Furthermore, Freydberg explicitly denigrates "Anglo-American philosophy teachers" in several passages, as noted below. So, it does not seem as if he has these potential readers in mind, either, except to promote stereotypes about them. On multiple levels Freydberg should have given more thought to his likely and potential audience.

As noted, before the chapter on Schelling, Freydberg offers a brief "Intermezzo" on German idealism. When he describes this section in the comments that open the book, he previews it as an attempt "to demonstrate another virtually unprecedented view, namely, of Hegel as a positive precursor to the philosophy of Schelling" (7). The intermezzo is somewhat confusing on this point because what Freydberg in fact argues is: "it has been a serious misreading of Hegel to ascribe negative judgments to his contemporary (i.e., Schelling)" (82). Then he produces passages in which Hegel praises Schelling. But surely this is not what he has in mind as groundbreaking. Perhaps Freydberg means that it is virtually unheard of to construe Hegel as a positive precursor to Schelling. But the relations between Hegel and Schelling's thought can be plausibly redescribed in many ways, as Richard Rorty would remind us. In any case, Freydberg's claim is not what it is advertised to be.

This is not to take anything away from Freydberg's scholarly and appreciative discussion of Schelling. One of Freydberg's strengths is his ability to bring to bear his considerable knowledge of ancient Greek poetry and philosophy, and his chapter on Schelling is a good example of this. But while the scholarship is impressive and suggestive, it does not justify the exalted place given to Schelling.

In the final section, "Coda: Nietzsche as Crux," Freydberg begins by claiming that the "primary significance" of Nietzsche's early work "concerns the way it lays out its concealed anteriority, the life-giving darkness that resides beneath its surface giving it what life it has" (123). There are many reasons a historian of modern philosophy might place Nietzsche at the end. But mostly these are not of interest to Freydberg. It is Nietzsche's affirmation of the "Dionysian impulse" that captures his attention (124). Reason is finally put in its place.

Unfortunately, by forcing the narrative of modern philosophy to be read through the cloudy prism of anteriority, Freydberg renders it more obscure and remote. He owes it to his readers to push himself to greater clarity and articulacy. By comparison, Neiman's alternative history of philosophy reveals underlying debates that are easily missed and very profound. Her approach yields fresh insights and new lines of research. There is no such harvest from Freydberg.

What is worse, Freydberg is at times almost comically polemical and condescending. He even stoops to ad hominem attacks on some philosophers who have differing views. For example, in his discussion of Spinoza, Freydberg describes "benighted" Hans Reichenbach's book, The Rise of Scientific Philosophy, as "stupid" and as "condescending psychobabble." He also attributes its multiple printings to the "support of Anglo-American philosophers too careless and too arrogant to study their own history while mangling every significant figure in philosophy before him (i.e., Spinoza)" (56-57).

Freydberg also claims that Anglo-American philosophy professors -- again, taken as a lump of bogeymen -- are poor readers and teachers of modern philosophy. They "focus on individual arguments and subject them to evaluation, often finding them wanting." But the fix is in from the beginning, according to Freydberg, because these biased teachers believe "genuine philosophy did not begin until the twentieth century" (30). After much reflection, I cannot think of a single Anglo-American philosopher who fits this simplistic and deeply inaccurate description. However, the kicker comes later in the very same context, in a moment of breathtaking irony, when Freydberg chides teachers of modern philosophy for not observing the principle of charity in their work (31).

A Dark History of Modern Philosophy is dark and uninviting indeed.